The Ethics of Global Climate Change

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Denis G. Arnold (ed.), The Ethics of Global Climate Change, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 340pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107000698.

Reviewed by Kristin Shrader-Frechette, University of Notre Dame


The fifteen selections in this Arnold anthology on climate change (CC) have much to recommend them. Perhaps most important is that they focus on one of today's most urgent scientific and policy issues. The introductory essay, by Denis Arnold, provides an excellent overview of the problem. The second selection, by Dale Jamieson, argues that a new value system is needed to address CC. Instead, the third chapter, by Stephen Gardiner -- author of the widely acclaimed CC monograph, A Perfect Moral Storm (2011) -- argues that holding people and nations politically accountable, rather than a new value system, is needed to resolve CC.

In the fourth selection, John Nolt shows that, because of our unjust domination, we harm future generations through CC. Simon Caney next argues that, beyond some sort of per-capita, equal-emissions-distribution scheme, as suggested by Nolt, ethical resolution of the climate problem also requires ensuring that its victims have minimally decent standards of living. The sixth essay, by Darrel Moellendorf, continues to address equity themes, arguing that libertarians should be committed to even greater CC mitigation than egalitarians are. Luc Bovens, however, rejects the basic argument of the previous two selections and instead argues that CC solutions must take account of grandfathering, of different actors' differential investments, prior to their knowledge of the harms of CC. Developing the insights of psychoanalyst Erik Erikson, Sarah Krakoff argues in the eighth chapter that CC must be addressed by mature humans who resolve to "parent the planet."

The ninth selection, by Robert Socolow and Mary English, builds on Socolow's classic Science article with Stephen Pacala on climate "stabilization wedges." It showed that by using any six of at least nine different renewable energy, efficiency, or non-nuclear solutions -- all wedges in the climate "pie," and all already deployed at an industrial scale, one could completely solve the climate problem by 2050. In arguably one of the strongest essays in the volume, Socolow and English show that developed nations ought not use as much per capita energy as developing countries. Continuing the "wedge" theme, Philip Cafaro argues for "alternative wedges" based on changes in personal behavior, not just changes in national or international policy. As CC solutions, he defends decreased consumption, lowered economic growth, and reduced population growth.

In the eleventh chapter, Richard Morgenstern sketches a number of CC policies that would also keep the US economically competitive. These include cap and trade, revised standards, and innovative trade policies. Disagreeing with Morgenstern, Alice Kaswan addresses cap-and-trade solutions to CC, arguing that because of their environmental-justice problems, regulations are preferable. Next, Neil Adger and Sophie Nicholson-Cole argue that, in order for any CC adaptation to work, greater environmental understanding and more participatory solution schemes are needed. In the fourteenth essay, Clare Palmer argues for better understanding of CC effects on the nonhuman world. In the final essay, Henry Shue argues that it is unlikely that this generation will meet the ethical requirements necessary to address the needs of the poor and the fossil-fuel poor who are victimized by CC.

Of at least three strengths of this volume, perhaps the most compelling is the urgency and ethical importance of its topic. Climate change threatens the survival of at least two billion people and the economic interests of even more. Yet, adequately addressing this issue will force society and scholars to somehow untangle the notoriously difficult issues of collective responsibility and the tragedy of the commons.

A second asset of this anthology is the logical contact among various essays, such as among the Bovens, Caney, and Moellendorf pieces; between the Gardiner and Jamieson chapters; between the Socolow-English and Cafaro papers; and between the Morgenstern and Kaswan essays. This selection of articles thus avoids a typical weakness of many anthologies based on conference proceedings: their failure to include contributions that genuinely address each other.

A third strength of this volume is the stellar essays of contributors such as Arnold, Bovens, Cafaro, Caney, Gardiner, Morgenstern, Socolow-English, and Shue. Arnold's essay shows an excellent grasp of the CC issue, and it does an excellent job of summarizing the basic science and ensuring that it is up-to-date. Bovens, Caney, and Shue, in particular, do superb analyses of how to develop human-rights theory to address CC. Shue, for instance, who in 1993 began publishing ethical analyses of CC problems, is the ethical "lion" of CC research. He uses brilliant human-rights arguments both to undergird CC mitigation and to criticize some academic theorists' misguided adoption of Marxist and Hegelian criticisms of human rights. As always, Gardiner's lean, precise prose reveals arguments that are both analytically astute and insightful. Cafaro likewise deserves praise for being one of the few CC theorists who brings ethical analysis down to the personal, rather than merely the institutional, level. After reading Cafaro, one knows what one ought to do, regardless of what nations do. Morgenstern's contribution also is crucially important because it brilliantly addresses one of the major objections to CC mitigation: harming US competitiveness.

Despite such brilliant essays, one of the flaws of this volume is its unevenness in quality, a result perhaps of the fact that the essays originated as early 2008 conference presentations. Several of the essays resort to preaching, instead of astute analysis. Most readers, for instance, are not interested in repeatedly hearing sermons such as that "These virtues -- love, care, and wisdom -- are the grown-up ones. They are the virtues necessary to accept a role of care-taking, of reducing our own demands on the Earth in order to cultivate the conditions for all human communities" (p. 167). Other chapters in the volume belabor the obvious, as when they claim to "have argued that we are, by our carbon emissions, unjustly dominating posterity" (p. 75).

Perhaps worst of all, some essays by internationally distinguished ethicists make false, unsubstantiated, vague, or outdated scientific claims, such as the following: (A) "Electricity generated by photovoltaics is 2-5 times more expensive than electricity currently delivered to residential customers" (p. 23). (B) "If solar energy were to supply the American energy grid with a significant fraction of demand, large areas would have to be covered with photovoltaic cells" (p. 23). (C) "Wind-generated electricity … is even approaching the cost of electricity generation from a new, coal-fired power plant" (p. 23).

The author's claim (A), that solar-photovoltaic is 2-5 times more expensive than currently delivered electricity, is incorrect. US Department of Energy data show that the 2010 median price, as well as the average price, of US electricity to consumers is roughly 10 cents per kilowatt-hour and rising, while solar-photovoltaic prices are 15 cents per kilowatt-hour and dropping. By 2015, the US Department of Energy says solar-photovoltaic will achieve cost-parity in all markets.

Likewise, the author's claim (B), that solar energy would require "large areas" to be covered with photovoltaic cells, does not stand up to scrutiny. In 2004, the US Department of Energy (DOE) specifically rejected (B) as a myth. It noted that no new land would be needed to supply all US electricity with solar-photovoltaic panels because one could meet far more than 100 percent of US electricity demands by using solar-photovoltaic installations only on commercial rooftops and commercial parking lots. (Yet obviously 100 percent of US electricity is unlikely to be supplied by solar, given that DOE says wind already provides nearly one-quarter of the electricity in some US states.)

Claims, such as (C), that energy costs from wind energy "are even approaching" those from coal plants, are misleading. For one thing, government data reveal that average wind-energy prices are 6.1 cents per kilowatt-hour, that median US wind prices are 4.3 cents per kilowatt-hour and as low as 1-2 cents per kilowatt-hour, that average coal prices are 8 cents per kilowatt-hour, and that wind achieved competitive-cost parity with coal in 2008 -- three years before the Arnold volume was published. Claim (C) also is misleading because it ignores the social costs of coal, including climate change and the preventable deaths of hundreds of thousands of people from other, non-carbon-equivalent, fossil-fuel pollutants, as documented by groups such as the US National Academy of Sciences.

Authors in the Arnold volume also make factually misleading or outdated claims about nuclear fission. One author, for instance, citing only nuclear-industry websites or outdated (2004) science, makes three at least questionable claims: (D) Regarding "emissions of greenhouse gases," "when embodied energy is included, nuclear still does well on this dimension relative to fossil fuels and perhaps even photovoltaics" [no citation] (p. 25). (E) "Heavy reliance on nuclear power is part of why Europe has lower per capita emissions of greenhouse gases than the USA" (p. 25). (F) Nuclear "waste will have to be managed for at least 10,000 years" [no citation] (p. 25).

For at least two reasons, claim (D) is misleading in asserting that "embodied" (at consumption point) greenhouse emissions from nuclear power are low, perhaps even compared to emissions from photovoltaics. One reason is that nuclear emissions are at least equal to those of natural gas. As confirmed by independent Dutch, English, German, UK, US, and other university scientists, full, 14-stage-fuel-cycle greenhouse emissions from nuclear fission are extraordinarily high, roughly double the full-fuel-cycle emissions of solar photovoltaics. A second problem with claim (D) is that "embodied" emissions (the made-up language of the nuclear industry and some political discussions) -- are scientifically irrelevant. For obvious reasons, top researchers in all nations compare full-fuel-cycle emissions, not at-plant or at-consumption-point "embodied" emissions.

Claim (E) also is misleading in claiming that greater reliance on nuclear energy helps explain why Europe allegedly has lower per capita greenhouse emissions than the US. One reason this claim is flawed is that the author compares per capita greenhouse emissions solely on the basis of "embodied" (at-consumption-point or from-the-plant) emissions, not full fuel-cycle emissions. As already noted, this is one of the same errors presupposed by the author's claim (D). When one compares full-fuel-cycle emissions, nuclear fission does not lower per-capita greenhouse emissions except with respect to coal and oil, as university researchers throughout the world have confirmed.

A second problem with (E) is the author's focus on electricity generation, rather than transport. That is, a more prominent reason the US has higher per-capita greenhouse emissions than Europe is not the relative size of their respective nuclear outputs, but the relative sizes of emissions from their respective transport sectors. According to official 2009 EU reports and current US Department of Transportation analyses, although Europe and the US have roughly the same percentages of greenhouse emissions because of electricity production (32 percent and 33 percent, respectively), only 18 percent of European greenhouse emissions come from transport -- given high European reliance on mass transit. Yet 28 percent of US greenhouse emissions come from transport -- given heavy US dependence on private autos. Moreover, roughly 30 percent of European electricity is supplied by fission, whereas that figure is 20 percent in the US. The upshot? Arguably higher private auto and petroleum use, not lower nuclear use, better explain higher US (than European) per capita greenhouse emissions.

A third problem with claim (E) is its ignoring the fact that renewable energy supplies double the percentage of electricity in Europe that it provides in the US. According to the EU, the ratio of European:US percentages of nuclear-generated electricity = 3:2. However, the ratio of European: US percentages of renewables-generated electricity = 2:1. Thus a more plausible reason for Europe's lower (than those of the US) per capita greenhouse emissions is that it has 200 percent more renewable-energy production than the US, not that it has 150 percent more nuclear production than the US -- especially because renewables emissions are nearly zero, and nuclear emissions are not, as already noted.

Claim (F) likewise is misleading because, as both the US National Academy of Sciences, the US Environmental Protection Agency, and other reputable groups have confirmed since at least 1995, nuclear waste will have to be managed for at least 1,000,000 years. This is 100 times longer than this anthology author erroneously suggests.

As this quick analysis of claims (A)-(F) reveals, the volume is not only uneven in quality and scientific accuracy, but some of the essays are self defeating. If distinguished ethicists (who appear not to know the relevant science) make egregious errors -- such as (A)-(F) -- in reporting on clean alternatives to fossil fuels, they not only mislead readers but also harm the CC-mitigation efforts they obviously support. They hurt their own cause. The problem of the unevenness of the volume might have been solved by including essays by reputable ethicists who work on CC issues. Such ethicists include Robert Goodin, Naomi Oreskes, Peter Singer, and Walter Sinnott-Armstrong. Their essays are almost certain to have been better than many of the selections that appear in this anthology.

A second worry about the volume is its inadequate responses (with the exception of the Socolow-English and the Morgenstern chapters) to the objections of those who argue against CC mitigation and greenhouse-gas reduction. Of course, not every essay need address such objections, but more than two should have done so. If practical ethics is to be practically useful, it needs to address concerns that real people in the real world have. If practical ethics is to be intellectually respectable, it needs to provide second- and higher-order analyses, including classic objections -- not mostly provide first-order arguments for a particular stance.

Where do the preceding comments leave us? Perhaps in a position similar to that articulated by Charles Dickens. At the beginning of A Tale of Two Cities, he wrote that it was the best of times, and it was the worst of times. This book presents the best of CC ethical scholarship and some poor CC ethical scholarship. Instead of reading this entire book, philosophers seeking enlightenment on the ethics of CC might be better advised to read Stephen Gardiner's A Perfect Moral Storm (2011) or Naomi Oreskes and Eric Conway's Merchants of Doubt (2010), or Peter Singer's climate chapter in One World (2002), or any of the climate essays by stellar writers such as Henry Shue.