The Ethics of Human Enhancement: Understanding the Debate

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Steve Clarke, Julian Savulescu, C. A. J. Coady, Alberto Giubilini, and Sagar Sanyal (eds.), The Ethics of Human Enhancement: Understanding the Debate, Oxford University Press, 2016, 269pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198754855.

Reviewed by Stephen M. Campbell, Bentley University, and Sven Nyholm, Eindhoven University of Technology


Humanity is rapidly developing technologies that hold the promise or peril (depending on your perspective) of reshaping what it means to be a human being. Should we embrace human enhancement technologies, or should we resist them? This is the primary question underlying the human enhancement debate. So-called "bioliberals" and "transhumanists" tend to optimistically welcome the arrival of human enhancement. "Bioconservatives" have in-principle objections to it. Others -- who are less easily labeled -- take a more moderate position, which often involves having different reactions to different types of enhancement.

This collection offers an overview and assessment of various facets of the human enhancement debate. According to the editors, this debate has reached an impasse, and there is a need for new arguments and explanations. The two chief aims of this book are to help readers understand the existing debate and to move the debate forward. It consists of an introductory chapter by Alberto Giubilini and Sagar Sanyal (which lays out some prominent bioconservative objections to enhancement), eight essays grouped under the theme of "Understanding the Debate" (Section I), and eight devoted to "Advancing the Debate" (Section II). In what follows, we offer brief summaries of each essay and ask whether the book successfully advances the debate.

Section I opens with three essays that are more directly concerned with moral psychology than the ethics of human enhancement. C. A. J. Coady's "Reason, Emotion, and Morality" reviews aspects of the history of philosophy and psychology, contemporary neuroscience, and the philosophy of emotion for the purpose of highlighting various ways in which our emotional and cognitive abilities are intertwined. This is loosely related to the enhancement debate insofar as it challenges the tendency to associate the bioliberal/bioconservative divide with a simplistic reason/emotion divide. The other essays offer a fascinating multi-layered critique of Leon Kass' controversial suggestion that there is some moral wisdom in our reactions of repugnance and disgust. Joshua May's "Repugnance as Performance Error" argues that our disgust reactions are not actually a source of our moral judgments and that "repugnance is best treated as an exogenous variable that yields 'performance errors'" in much the way that fatigue does (51). In "Reasons, Reflection, and Repugnance," Doug McConnell and Jeanette Kennett raise various objections to Kass' view, appealing to cross-cultural and -temporal variation in disgust reactions and to cases where morally irrelevant factors trigger disgust. They then draw upon work by Karen Jones on reason-responsiveness and Valerie Tiberius and Jason Swartwood on wisdom to cast doubt on Kass' claim about the normative authority of deep repugnance.

Linda Barclay's "A Natural Alliance Against a Common Foe? Opponents of Enhancement and the Social Model of Disability" shifts attention to the ethics of procreation. The essay is framed as an exploration of how much opponents of enhancement and disability advocates have in common, though it is perhaps more naturally seen as a critique of the view that parents should not seek to alter genetic or biological features of their children. Barclay begins with the enhancement critic Michael Sandel, who rejects human enhancement though he seems open to therapeutic interventions to eliminate disease and disability. Drawing on work by disability scholars, Barclay faults Sandel for accepting a problematic distinction between the normal/natural and the abnormal/diseased. She then turns to the more sophisticated views of disability advocates, who are generally critical of prenatal selection against disability and will surely also resist the push for enhancement. Barclay thinks that disability advocates lack a convincing story as to why it's wrong to cause disability and devotes almost half of the essay to critiquing Elizabeth Barnes' attempt to provide such a story. Although this essay deals more with disability than enhancement, Barclay's discussion (particularly in her concluding section) is very insightful and has the worthwhile goal of bringing disability studies into conversation with the enhancement debate.

The next two essays analyze specific dimensions of the bioconservative critique of enhancement. John Weckert's "Playing God: What Is the Problem?" seeks a viable secular interpretation of the charge that enhancing ourselves is "playing God." After considering and rejecting an "interfering with nature" reading, Weckert ultimately moves to an interpretation on which we play God when we expand our sphere of control beyond the point at which we can make competent decisions. Drawing on the work of G. A. Cohen and comparisons with mid-20th-century Christian objections to artificial insemination, John McMillan's "Conservative and Critical Morality in Debate about Reproductive Technologies" interprets conservative objections to reproductive enhancement technologies as being about the values or value-institutions that are threatened by these practices.

In an attempt to understand the human enhancement debate at a more fundamental level, Chris Gyngell and Michael J. Selgelid's "Human Enhancement: Conceptual Clarity and Moral Significance" offers a much-needed systematic analysis of the various ways that the term "enhancement" has been used in the literature. In the first portion of their essay, they provide an excellent review of seven distinct accounts of enhancement, highlighting some of their implications, advantages, and drawbacks. The second portion of the essay seeks to establish that the enhancement concept is "useful in moral and policy debates." In our view, while this second part contains some interesting insights, it is rather thin and does not convincingly argue that all seven of the concepts have useful roles to play in framing debates. For instance, invoking a highly revisionist welfarist conception of enhancement (enhancements = alterations that improve well-being) seems less useful than simply asking what effects this or that enhancement (defined in some other way) would have on well-being.

The final essay of Section I -- Robert Sparrow's "Human Enhancement for Whom?" -- examines the interests of various stakeholders in reproductive decisions about what kind of children to have. After reviewing some well-trodden terrain regarding the interests of the child and the parents, Sparrow offers some novel insights about how the interests of "the world" (i.e. the aggregate interests of all existing welfare-bearers), the species, the nation, and the race might bear on procreative decisions. While, in our view, well-being is hardly the only consideration relevant to the ethics of modifying children,[1] it is undoubtedly a weighty one and Sparrow offers a helpful treatment of the topic.

Section II ("Advancing the Debate") opens with Rebecca Roache and Julian Savulescu’s "Enhancing Conservatism." The authors question whether the "established wisdom" to which conservatives often appeal really speaks against enhancement. They then consider whether and how bioconservatives might object to enhancements aimed at promoting the very sorts of values that bioconservatives cherish. They anticipate and respond to two objections that bioconservatives might raise: enhancing people in this way could serve to dehumanize them, and it might lead to an excess of the valued traits. Oddly, the authors fail to acknowledge the fact that many bioconservatives care not only about the end-state of people possessing certain valued traits but also the means by which they come to acquire these traits. Despite this rather glaring omission, this piece by Roache and Savulescu breaks some new ground and is one of the highlights of this collection.

The next article injects a new (or, rather, old but obscure) line of bioconservative argument into the debate. In a 1979 article published in Hastings Center Report, Alasdair MacIntyre proposed seven virtues that he claims we would want to instill in future generations if we were to undertake an enhancement project. According to MacIntyre, these future generations -- in virtue of their propensity "to engage in non-manipulative relations with others" -- would be "so aghast at what we had done to them that they would in turn be unwilling to design their descendants" (160). Bernadette Tobin's article "MacIntyre's Paradox" analyzes this discussion and ultimately arrives at an explanation of the putative paradox that draws upon Aristotelian ideas of moral development.

In "Partiality for Humanity and Enhancement," Jonathan Pugh, Guy Kahane, and Savulescu argue that bioconservatives' appeal to the intrinsic value of human nature is less promising than the strategy of defending a reasonable partiality for human nature inasmuch as it is our nature. Drawing upon work by Bernard Williams and G. A. Cohen, the authors sketch what such a defense might look like but then argue that these reasons of partiality will be rather weak and limited -- and thus cannot ground a strong objection to enhancement. To our minds, this is a rather curious gift to offer bioconservatives. They are essentially being invited to embrace a rationale for bioconservatism that, according to these authors, is too weak to actually support the bioconservative position.

While much of this anthology feels like a bioliberal assault on arguments that have been offered by bioconservatives, there are some outstanding essays in Section II that turn a critical eye toward the bioliberal side. Michael Hauskeller's "Levelling the Playing Field: On the Alleged Unfairness of the Genetic Lottery" is a critical examination of the suggestion from some bioliberals that we are obligated to employ enhancement to alleviate the unfair distribution of genetic traits. Hauskeller covers a series of topics related to this view, including (though not limited to) the question of whether this obligation would extend across species lines, the epistemic difficulties that would attend this kind of leveling project, and the apparent implication that life is a competition. Steve Clarke's "Buchanan and the Conservative Argument Against Human Enhancement from Biological and Social Harmony" seeks to revive a bioconservative objection to enhancement and defend it against Allen Buchanan's criticisms. The gist of the objection, as Clarke develops it, is that certain enhancements (e.g. a substantial increase in human intelligence or longevity) may serve to undermine the stability of democratic societies. After reviewing ideas from conservative thought and biological anthropology, Clarke argues that this objection has more merit than many have appreciated and that it needn't appeal only to bioconservatives.

One striking feature of this anthology is that most of the essays focus attention on enhancement in general. The remaining three essays are the exception. Nicholas Agar's contribution "Enhancement, Mind-Uploading, and Personal Identity" concerns the popular transhumanist idea that, in the near future, we humans will be able to achieve greater longevity, if not immortality, by uploading our minds onto computers. Agar aims to show that such "survival by copying" is impossible. At the core of his argument is the idea that there can be a major alteration in one's identity (e.g. death, fission, fusion, body transfer) only if one undergoes a "significant interference." A significant interference, as Agar conceives of it, is a disjunctive phenomenon, where each disjunct is a disruption of what matters for personal identity according to one of the leading theories of personal identity (e.g. a major disruption in psychological continuity, a disruption in physical continuity, a Cartesian ego is destroyed or decisively separated from a particular human body). Since copying a person's mind does not essentially involve a significant interference, he concludes that we cannot copy our minds onto machines. While we applaud Agar's engagement with this important topic and found much of his essay interesting and worthwhile (particularly the discussion of pseudo-fission and "identity illusions"), it deserves mention that his conception of a significant interference is constructed exclusively from theories on which survival by copying is impossible, and he provides little argument for excluding other theories (notably, Derek Parfit's) on which it is possible. This casts doubt on whether he has successfully argued for his main conclusion.

The other two essays tackle the topic of moral enhancement. Gregory E. Kaebnick's "Moral Enhancement, Enhancement, and Sentiment" is a rich and thoughtful discussion of what moral enhancement might involve, whether it would undermine our moral practices or our freedom (and how our favored answer will depend on our theoretical views about freedom and morality), and the possibility that some who are generally critical of human enhancement might make an exception for moral enhancement.

Last but certainly not least, Russell Powell and Buchanan's "The Evolution of Moral Enhancement" critiques the idea -- recently defended by Ingmar Persson and Savulescu in their Unfit for the Future: The Need for Moral Enhancement -- that we should pursue biomedical moral enhancement of humans if we are to address urgent global problems. The authors recount the prevailing evolutionary story about humans' moral capacities, defend a competing story that sees our moral psychology as an adaptively plastic trait, and make the case that biomedical moral enhancement is not necessary (or likely) to play a role in averting potential moral catastrophes. The better path forward, they suggest, is to strive to create social conditions that foster "inclusivist" moral responses and do not trigger out-group bias. This article overlaps fairly extensively with other recent publications by Powell and Buchanan on closely related themes.

We turn now to a holistic evaluation of this collection. First of all, does it make good on its claim to "advance the debate"? In some ways, it undoubtedly does. Essays from both Sections I and II push further in the critical examination of a number of arguments and objections that have been proposed by prominent opponents and proponents of enhancement. It is not quite as comprehensive as one would hope. While some themes (e.g. Kass' wisdom of repugnance view, Cohen's conservatism, Jonathan Haidt's work on moral psychology, and moral enhancement) are discussed by multiple authors, there is virtually no critical examination of other important arguments in the human enhancement debate -- for instance, Nick Bostrom and Toby Ord's suggestion that enhancement critics may be guilty of status quo bias, or the worry that enhancements will exacerbate existing inequalities. And there are some interesting discussions within the ethics of enhancement, such as the debate about relationship- and love-enhancements and the debate over performance-enhancement in sports, that receive no mention at all. This is so despite the fact that one of the collection's editors, Savulescu, is an important and vocal contributor to those debates.

Despite its many virtues, this book does not advance the human enhancement debate in certain ways that, to our minds, would be desirable. First, this collection -- like some of the bioconservative critics with whom it is engaging -- maintains an abstract focus on human enhancement in general. Given the diversity of potential human enhancements (e.g. intelligence, creativity, memory, attention, height, strength, stamina, moral capacity, aesthetic capacity, mood, emotion, longevity, brain-machine interfaces), there is little reason to believe -- at least, prior to investigation -- that it is productive to engage in extensive debate about whether enhancement tout court is to be pursued or avoided. Indeed, it is reasonable to expect that certain forms of enhancement will be acceptable in certain contexts for certain individuals, and others will not. We should not frame the human enhancement debate in a way that encourages a simplistic dichotomy of for-enhancement vs. against-enhancement. Turning our attention to particular forms of enhancement will encourage the development of more nuanced views -- such as, to cite one example, John Harris' endorsement of cognitive enhancement and opposition to moral enhancement.

Second, this collection perpetuates the trend of enhancement critics mostly playing offense and enhancement proponents mostly playing defense. In the majority of the essays, the focal point is enhancement critics' positive arguments for why we should avoid human enhancement and proponents' responses to those arguments. While that interchange is no doubt important, criticism of broad arguments against enhancement is no substitute for positive argumentation in favor of pursuing the various types of enhancement that may become available to us. There should be more debate surrounding the justifications and arguments for the need and/or desirability of modifying ourselves and our progeny -- with particular attention to whether particular ways of enhancing capacities will actually serve to enhance the quality of human lives.

Overall, this book is an excellent contribution to the existing literature on the ethics of human enhancement. It deserves the attention of anyone who is eager to delve deeper into the on-going philosophical conversation about human enhancement, and it should be of special interest to so-called bioconservatives since so much of the book is grappling with that viewpoint. In our opinion, the book is not comprehensive enough to be useful as the sole text in a course on the ethics of human enhancement. However, it could be quite useful if paired with additional readings that weigh the potential benefits and costs of specific forms of enhancement.


[1] See, for instance, David Wasserman, 2017, "Better Parenting Through Biomedical Modification," forthcoming in Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal.