The Ethics of Immigration

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Joseph H. Carens, The Ethics of Immigration, Oxford University Press, 2013, 364pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199933839.

Reviewed by Arash Abizadeh, McGill University


This long-awaited, judicious book on the ethics of interstate migration, by one of the field's founding figures, brings together two strands of Joseph Carens's previous writings on the topic. In the book's first part, he provisionally grants "the conventional view" that states are morally entitled to exercise considerable discretionary control over admissions. His overarching thesis is that, even granting the conventional view, fundamental liberal democratic norms imply that anyone who has resided in a state for several years -- with or without the state's authorization -- has a moral claim to the status and rights of citizenship. Carens then proceeds, in the book's second part, to challenge the conventional view, and offers a restatement of his well-known "open borders" argument according to which there is a human right to freedom of movement across state borders.

In the first, more policy-oriented part of the book, Carens claims that much of his task is simply to articulate the core normative principles that justify existing practices and about which there is considerable consensus in liberal democratic states, and to apply those principles to migration issues (5-9).  He believes that contemporary liberal democracies are committed to two types of human rights: general human rights, borne by each human being against all states, and membership-specific human rights, borne by each human being against only the particular state of which she is a member (93-97). (The rights of bodily integrity illustrate the former, the right to seek employment perhaps the latter.) He also takes one norm in particular to be the object of consensus and to justify many core features of existing practice: the social-membership norm, according to which the moral claim to the status and rights of citizenship is primarily grounded in facts and expectations about persons' social membership, i.e., persons' embeddedness in "a dense network of relationships and associations" and "identities" that are intimately "connected" to a polity and its residents and hence socially located within that polity (164).

Carens's argument begins with the observation that the discretion claimed by states over admissions is conventionally acknowledged to be subject to two important constraints: that citizens outside of a state's territory have a right of re-entry and that many persons are entitled to acquire citizenship as their birthright. Carens initially derives the social-membership norm from the deeply entrenched practice of birthright citizenship: what morally justifies the universal jus sanguinis practice of unconditionally granting citizenship to the children of citizens, he argues, is that one can normally expect such children to become social members of the polity. The same reasoning justifies the jus soli practice of unconditionally granting a legal right of citizenship to babies born in the polity's territory to non-citizen parents.

With the social-membership norm in hand, Carens proceeds to consider the moral claims of migrants -- children or adult, authorized or unauthorized. In each case, he argues that the norm restricts state discretion in its treatment of non-citizens. Since migrants eventually develop, over the course of residing in a polity, a network of social ties that constitutes social membership, the social-membership norm implies that all persons acquire an unconditional moral claim to citizenship after several years of residence. Their claim is not conditional on lacking anti-liberal or anti-democratic beliefs, renouncing other citizenships, good character, having sufficient funds, or passing tests of civic competence. To premise citizenship on beliefs is to violate the human right to freedom of conscience; on renouncing other citizenships serves no genuine state interest; on good character is to invite procedural abuses; on sufficient funds is to discriminate against the poor; and on civic tests is to embrace the undemocratic view that citizenship hinges on competence. The only limit that Carens is willing to concede, on the conventional assumption that states have considerable moral discretion over border policies, is the absence of a criminal record, but only the absence of a criminal record that would morally warrant and actually result in the state deporting the migrant (53-58).

With respect to temporary workers, Carens argues that they should enjoy the same rights governing their working conditions as citizens; that excluding temporary workers from the benefits of social programs linked to contributions from workers' salaries, and into which temporary workers also pay, violates a norm of reciprocity (which Carens supposes to be another liberal democratic norm); but that, granting the conventional view, the moral claim of temporary workers to the benefits of other, morally optional social programs only arises after several years of residence (a proxy for social membership).  He further argues that, even assuming the conventional view, unauthorized migrants too should enjoy legal rights to be paid for their work and to the same working conditions as citizens -- but not the right to seek work.

He also makes the very important argument that liberal democracies' commitment to respecting everyone's general human rights requires providing unauthorized migrants with the state services necessary for protecting those rights, and that to do so effectively requires erecting a "firewall" between the provision of those services and state enforcement of visa regulations. Just as evidence gathered by police in violation of individuals' constitutional rights should be barred from criminal court proceedings, so too should information revealed about a migrant's visa status in the course of seeking medical care not be used against the migrant in immigration enforcement procedures.

Even granting the conventional view, Carens argues that race, ethnicity, religion, sexual orientation, and ideology are morally impermissible grounds for excluding potential migrants, although poverty and a significant criminal record are permissible grounds. Carens's justification for ruling out race, ethnicity, religion, and sexual orientation is that such exclusions would violate a liberal democratic norm against "stigmatizing form[s] of discrimination" (179).  He rules out ideology by appeal to the liberal democratic norm of freedom of conscience; and he suggests that excluding migrants because of poverty or a significant criminal record, where they do not have an independent moral claim to admission, is permissible because such exclusions serve an important public interest (174-179).

Carens does not attack the conventional view until the book's second part. Beginning from the premise that all humans have equal moral worth -- such that moral justification requires taking into account everyone's interests in a way that is fair to all -- he concludes that there is a general human right to freedom of interstate migration. He does so on the basis of three arguments, respectively appealing to the value of freedom of movement for (1) individual autonomy, (2) equality of opportunity, and (3) substantive economic, social, and political equality at the global level. First, freedom of movement is both a direct condition or constituent of autonomy and a prerequisite to exercising other types of freedom (which are in turn themselves conditions or constituents of autonomy). Second, restricting movement on the basis of citizenship violates equality of opportunity because it restricts access to social opportunities on the basis of a status that is overwhelmingly ascribed at birth: it is to transform birthright citizenship into a "feudal class privilege" (226). And finally, if the global poor avail themselves of such opportunities by moving, then permitting free movement would alleviate substantive global inequalities (226-228).

Carens exerts his greatest energies on the first, autonomy argument. To show that liberal democracies are essentially already committed to the argument's premises -- in particular, to the presumption that a general human right to free movement is necessary to protect vital autonomy-related interests -- he appeals to what David Miller has called a "cantilever" argument. The cantilever argument purports to show that all the reasons for which liberal democracies treat freedom of movement within their own territory as a general human right are also reasons for treating freedom of movement between states as a general human right.

Carens considers several objections to this argument, the two most serious of which are that (a) even if there were vital interests at stake in domestically free movement, there are no equivalent interests in free movement between states, and that (b) in fact there are no vital interests that warrant recognizing domestic freedom of movement as a general human right. Carens dispenses with a strong formulation of (a) by arguing that the interests that impoverished, potential migrants have in being able freely to migrate to wealthier countries are often much more urgent than the interests that those residing in wealthy countries have in being able freely to move throughout the latter's entire territory. A weaker formulation of the objection, by Miller, poses greater difficulties: that there is no vital, autonomy-related interest in free interstate movement if one's own state already provides, domestically, an adequate range of valuable options and opportunities. Carens's response is that the adequate-options criterion fails to ground a domestic human right to free movement as well, since states might be perfectly capable of providing their residents with an adequate range of valuable options within some restricted portion of their territory (such as in a single province). To the objector who bites that bullet, and so effectively raises (b), the second objection to the autonomy argument, Carens counters by appealing directly to a vital interest in autonomy itself, i.e., in being free in the sense of "not being subject to the will of another" and hence not being subject to intentionally imposed restrictions on movement (236-249). (Critics who think that autonomy is perfectly compatible with justified restrictions might worry that this retort begs the question.)

Carens's book covers a lot of ground, so it should not be surprising if it raises as many questions as it answers. I shall here focus on the book's first part.[1]

Consider two important objections to the argument that temporary workers should have the same rights regulating working conditions as citizens. The first is that because (a) there is a range of morally permissible labour standards from which states may choose, it follows that if (b) labour rights in the sending and receiving states are both morally permissible but weaker in the former than the latter, then (c) it is morally permissible for the receiving state to apply to temporary workers the weaker standards normally used in the sending state. Alternatively: if (b) labour rights are weaker in the sending than the receiving state and the receiving state's standards are more generous than what is morally required, then (c) it is morally permissible for the receiving state to apply to its temporary workers weaker labour standards that are nevertheless still within the morally permissible range (and perhaps stronger than the sending state's standards). Carens grants the initial premise (a), but denies the conditional on the grounds that, because each state is "responsible for what goes on inside its own jurisdiction," it is morally required to apply uniform standards to all workers in its territory (115). Carens's assumption that territorial jurisdiction requires uniformity of territorial standards, however, ignores the potential legitimacy of legal pluralism and/or of special accommodations for distinct groups within a single territorial jurisdiction. We can properly speak of "accommodations," for example, in cases in which temporary workers themselves prefer having access to the receiving state's labour market under conditions approaching their home state's weaker labour standards -- say, because the weaker standards would increase the supply of temporary-worker positions.

This possibility is what grounds the second objection: that because weaker labour standards for temporary workers would increase job supply and hence admissions, adopting weaker standards would better enable wealthier states to fulfil their duty to reduce global poverty. Carens's response to this second objection essentially relies on his reply to the first: he argues that a state's duty "to reduce global poverty does not eliminate the duty to treat temporary workers fairly" (125), which raises the question of why it would be unfair to have different (albeit in themselves morally permissible) labour standards for temporary workers, in light of the fact that, by hypothesis, these different standards are welcomed by and would benefit the potential workers.

Another difficulty concerns Carens's conclusion that, on the one hand, unauthorized workers acquire a moral claim to citizenship over time, and their children have a moral claim to public education, because their fundamental, socially located interests are at stake, while, on the other hand, they have no moral claim to seek employment because any such right would be incompatible with the conventional view. The latter conclusion is hard to reconcile, however, with the fact that having access to paid work is also a fundamental, socially located interest.

Carens's firewall argument poses another set of concerns. Would erecting a firewall between general-human-rights protections and visa enforcement effectively emaciate state capacity to exercise its putative right of discretion in relation to unauthorized migrants? To be sure, unauthorized migrants will engage in activities in which general human rights are not at stake and during the course of which the state might permissibly gather visa information. But one might suspect that a proper firewall would rule out the vast array of available information-gathering opportunities -- resulting in considerable tension between Carens's firewall argument and his provisional concession to the conventional view. For example, Carens believes that freedom of movement within the state is, and is widely recognized as, a general human right. Does this mean that the state, in enforcing its visa regulations, must not use any visa-status information gathered while a person is exercising her right to freedom of domestic movement?

It also seems difficult to reconcile the permission to exclude potential migrants on poverty grounds with other aspects of Carens's argument. Consider that there may be an important public interest at stake in excluding migrants on some of the grounds that Carens does rule impermissible; for example, adherents of an anti-liberal, anti-democratic religion or ideology might pose a threat to the social ethos that he believes is required to realize the democratic ideal of equal citizenship in a polity. Of course Carens asserts (correctly) that the perception that immigrants pose a threat usually involves great exaggeration, but the heart of his response is that, even if the public interest would be served by such exclusions, they are impermissible because they would violate the norm against stigmatizing discrimination. But then why does excluding on the basis of poverty not run afoul of the same norm? Why is it impermissible to discriminate on the basis of religion in the name of the public interest, but permissible do so on the basis of poverty or social class?

These questions and criticisms notwithstanding, Carens's book comprises an important set of arguments and fair-minded reflections that is required reading for anyone working on the ethics of interstate migration.[2]

[1] For further critical discussion, see Arash Abizadeh, "The Rights of Migrants and the Protection of Fundamental Human Interests: On Carens's The Ethics of Immigration," Political Theory (Forthcoming).

[2] A complaint for the publisher rather than author: References appear towards the end of the book, using the author/year method, in endnotes for each chapter listed by number rather than chapter title and without any information about the corresponding range of page numbers. Since page headings in the body give chapter title rather than number, a reader interested in a reference will likely flip to the endnote section to (re)discover that knowing chapter title or page numbers is useless for finding the endnote without a chapter number; flip back to the chapter's first page to confirm the chapter number; flip back to the endnote section to find the author/year; and finally flip to the reference section for the full reference. What a pain.