The Ethics of Joy: Spinoza on the Empowered Life

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Andrew Youpa, The Ethics of Joy: Spinoza on the Empowered Life, Oxford University Press, 2020, 195pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190086022.

Reviewed by Matthew J. Kisner, University of South Carolina


After a long period of neglect, Spinoza's ethical theory has received significant attention over the past decade. While the growing scholarly literature has revealed a number of questions and disagreements, a central fault line has emerged concerning Spinoza's transition in the last parts of the Ethics from metaphysical topics to ethical topics. One camp reads Spinoza's metaphysics as undermining or even debunking ethics as based on illusions, for example, the belief in free will. Another camp sees Spinoza's metaphysics as providing the basis for a sincere and serious ethical theory, albeit one that may break in various ways with other ethical systems in Spinoza's time or our own. Andrew Youpa's book belongs squarely in the latter camp. It provides an interpretation of Spinoza's philosophy as aiming to reveal the ethically best life: a healthy life, lived in accordance with nature, and empowered by caring for oneself and others. Youpa's book is the culmination of twenty years of research on Spinoza's ethics, which until now has been available only in articles. It is a must read for anyone interested in the subject.

The first two chapters offer an interpretation of Spinoza's view of the emotions. Youpa's main claim is that Spinoza conceives of the emotions as representing and providing information about good and bad. To make this case, Youpa first explains precisely how the emotions represent. On his reading, the qualitative character of the emotions is supposed to represent the body's power in the same way that a symptom represents whatever it is a symptom of. According to this view, the ebullient feeling of joy represents an enhancement in the body's power in the same way that a fever represents an infection. Youpa regards evaluative judgments, which are more belief-like or propositional in nature, as subsequent mental states, based on the emotions but separate from them. He argues that the qualitative representations provide axiological information because they report on increases and decreases in our power, which Spinoza regards as good and bad respectively.

In chapters 3 through 6, Youpa explains Spinoza's theory of good and bad. The central question here is whether Spinoza subscribes to what Youpa calls moral realism, using the term in a distinctive way. As Youpa defines it, moral realism is the view that good and bad are objective properties, which are properties that exist independently of our attitudes, particularly our desires. He defends this reading on the grounds that Spinoza understood good and bad primarily as enhancements or impairments of our essential power, which are objective facts that stand independent of our attitudes. This part of the book is concerned to refute the moral anti-realist reading, particularly the version that regards good and bad as depending on our desires.

Chapters 7 through 10 set forth Spinoza's picture of a good or empowered life. They are guided by Youpa's claim that Spinoza's ethics is not an ethics of accountability, in other words, not an ethics concerned primarily with obligation, responsibility, and blame. Along these lines, he argues that it is also not an ethics that focuses on the value of particular actions. Rather, Youpa proposes that Spinoza's ethics offers an aspirational picture of the best form of life. Following a medical model, the best form of life is supposed to be a healthy life, one that accords with and realizes our nature. Youpa explains that such a life is one of freedom in the sense of being an adequate cause (chapter 8). It is also a life of tenacity, or enlightened care of oneself (chapter 9), and one of nobility, or care of others (chapter 10).

Youpa's book makes significant contributions to the rapidly developing literature on Spinoza's ethics. He devotes welcome attention to topics that are too often overlooked in the mainstream analytical literature, such as Spinoza's view on the value of friendship and education to a good life. Perhaps his most significant achievement is offering a more rigorous framework for mapping the philosophical terrain. A central challenge for researchers on Spinoza's ethics is the frustrating tendency for Spinoza scholars to blithely assume that their take on the subject is obviously true and thus does not require anything like a reasoned defense. The result is an unfortunate lack of engagement between researchers with serious disagreements about Spinoza's ethical theory and, even worse, a lack of recognition that the disagreements even exist. Youpa's book performs important foundational work by laying out central disagreements and issues, as well as spelling out important arguments for and against the various interpretive options.

Youpa's treatment of moral realism provides a particularly helpful mapping of the terrain. Spinoza scholars sometimes advance anti-realist readings with cursory references to a few of his more provocative-sounding claims about good and bad. Youpa precludes such hasty treatment by methodically laying out and defending other interpretive options. For example, readers of all levels have been tempted to read Spinoza as claiming that good and bad are relativistic in the sense of subjective, in other words, a matter of individual opinion or attitude. Youpa defends an alternative reading according to which good and bad are rather relational in the sense that things always have value for a subject. To use Spinoza's example, music is good for melancholy, bad for someone in mourning and neither good nor bad for the deaf. As Youpa points out, this does not imply that value is subjective. The value of music does not depend on one's opinions or attitudes, but rather on how it affects one's power, which is a matter of objective fact. Youpa makes a similar move by pointing out the frequently overlooked difference between Spinoza's views on value generally and his views on a particular class of values that he regards as purely conventional or artificial, in other words, as existing only in virtue of human agreement (3-4). This class includes the values of justice, sin and merit. Because of this difference, we cannot take Spinoza's claim that nothing is unjust in the state of nature as a general statement that values are human inventions that do not exist in nature (173-4).

One possible worry here is that using the issue of moral realism to frame disagreements about Spinoza's ethical theory may be anachronistic. I do not mean to suggest that there is anything inherently problematic about using present-day philosophical concepts and terms to describe historical views. Youpa is right to point out that such efforts can offer productive ways of unpacking Spinoza's claims and commitments (2, 6). But there is reason to worry that this particular concept is more obfuscating than illuminating in the context of Spinoza's philosophy. His metaphysics conceives of desires as identical to our conatus, that is, our essential causal power. Consequently, his philosophy appears unfriendly to the fundamental premise of the moral realism debate, namely, that whether something is real is determined by whether it exists independently of our desires. Given's Spinoza's view of desire, such a premise would be tantamount to claiming that whether something is real is determined by whether it exists independently of our power, which does not appear to be a claim that Spinoza would accept.

Youpa's interpretation also precludes hasty treatment of passages where Spinoza appears to suggest that we cannot have knowledge of good and bad (what Youpa calls moral knowledge), for instance, when Spinoza claims that a free man would form no concept of good and bad (4p68).[1] Youpa rightly points out the many reasons for concluding that Spinoza allows for moral knowledge, and he advances natural alternative readings of such passages. It is interesting to note, however, that Youpa's reading of Spinoza's view on moral knowledge in some ways pushes Spinoza in the direction of moral non-cognitivism, which is surprising given Youpa's insistence on the moral realist reading. Youpa takes Spinoza's moral realism to imply the naturalist view that good and bad are natural properties in the sense that they are the kinds of properties investigated by natural science, including medicine, which focuses on the property of health (86-7). In this respect, good and bad are "part of the fabric of the universe" (53). Given this commitment, one would expect Youpa's reading to hold that our knowledge of good and bad is basically the same as our knowledge of other natural facts, the sort of knowledge that we have in science.

Yet, on Youpa's reading, Spinoza regards moral knowledge as fundamentally different from metaphysical knowledge. Furthermore, moral knowledge is different precisely because it depends on our emotions. Youpa holds that we judge good and bad entirely from our emotions, such that our moral knowledge is inseparable from our emotional states. "Because emotions and desires are enhancements and impairments in power, the notions of goodness and badness are empty independent of emotions and desires" (116). To be clear, I am not suggesting that Youpa's reading inadvertently commits Spinoza to moral non-cognitivism. On Youpa's reading, we can have moral knowledge and this knowledge is objective in the sense that it concerns facts that stand independent of our attitudes. Nevertheless, Youpa also holds that moral knowledge is bound up with our emotions in ways that make it fundamentally different from the kind of knowledge that we have of other natural properties and from the knowledge that we have in natural science.

Youpa's reading moves Spinoza even closer to moral non-cognitivism because of how he interprets Spinoza's view that the emotions are cognitive. According to one common use of the term, to call something cognitive is to say that it possesses content, in other words, that it asserts something in virtue of which it can be assessed for truth, accuracy and epistemic norms. On this definition, cognitive mental states are fundamentally different from mental states that merely express our attitudes, such as approval or disapproval, which cannot be assessed in these ways. In contrast, Youpa defines a cognitive mental state as one that reports information. "Emotions are not cognitively empty. They carry information" (14); "emotions are information" (35). Youpa's definition of cognitive does not imply the familiar distinction between cognitive mental states that can be judged for truth and non-cognitive attitudes, such as the approval and disapproval expressed by statements like "boo" and "yay." According to Youpa's definition of cognitive, the disapproval expressed by "boo" would qualify as cognitive because it reports information, for instance, about the person's preferences.

This definition is important for understanding Youpa's claim that Spinoza "is not a non-cognitivist about emotion" (35). On Youpa's reading, an emotion, at least in the moral context, is a purely qualitative state, a "phenomenal feel" (34), like the boiling feeling of anger. An emotion "is not a propositionally structured representation of a state of affairs" (34). These mental states qualify as cognitive according to his definition because they contain information about one's power, but they are not cognitive in the usual sense of the term as possessing content that can be judged for truth. In light of this commitment, Youpa's reading moves Spinoza in the direction of moral non-cognitivism not only because it holds that moral conclusions are based on our emotions, but also because it holds that moral conclusions are based on mental states that are not cognitive, at least, not according to a conception of the term that is common in debates about moral non-cognitivism.

Youpa's reading of Spinoza's view of motivation indicates another interesting way that he moves Spinoza closer to moral non-cognitivist views. According to Youpa's reading, Spinoza regards emotions as the only motivating mental states. This means that cognitions, beliefs or judgments that are also emotions are inherently motivating, while those that are not emotions are motivationally inert. In this respect, Youpa reads Spinoza as subscribing to a Humean account of motivation, which has long been connected to moral non-cognitivism. But on his reading this commitment leads Spinoza to conclusions that directly oppose a traditional Humean account of motivation. According to Youpa, metaphysical knowledge necessarily increases our powers and, consequently, qualifies as a kind of joy, which means that metaphysical knowledge is intrinsically motivating. Moral knowledge, on the other hand, consists of judgments and cognitions that follow from the emotions. Consequently, moral knowledge is not intrinsically motivating, but rather acquires motivational power from prior emotions. On Youpa's reading, then, Spinoza holds the mirror image of Hume's view on motivation: moral knowledge is not intrinsically motivating but metaphysical knowledge is.

This discussion indicates possible directions for future work building on Youpa's interpretation or on similar interpretations. I would welcome more explanation of how to integrate Youpa's reading with a key proposition of the Ethics: "in the mind there is no volition, or affirmation and negation, except that which the idea involves insofar as it is an idea" (2p49). This passage is potentially problematic for Youpa's reading in several ways. One potential difficulty, which Youpa addresses (26), is squaring the passage with Youpa's distinction between moral emotions -- purely qualitative feels that register our power -- and moral judgments, which affirm something like propositions. If emotions and judgments are ultimately ideas (as all mental things are for Spinoza), then 2p49 seems to imply that they too should have contents, which would mean that the emotions cannot just be a qualitative feeling. The proposition is also challenging for Youpa's view that moral judgments are motivationally inert because they are not emotions. This is because 2p49 seems to imply that all ideas, even moral judgments, contain volitional and thus motivating power. Youpa might answer that Spinoza regards the motivational power of the emotions as distinct from the volitional power possessed by all ideas, in which case I am interested to learn more about how Youpa's reading explains the source of motivation.

I would also be interested to learn more about how Youpa's interpretation handles two other subjects, the first of which is desire. Youpa's explanation of the emotions primarily focuses on joy and sorrow, rather than desire, which Spinoza's identifies as the third main category of emotions. Youpa's main claim about the emotions is that they report ethical information about the state of our power, a claim that fits nicely with Spinoza's view of joy and sorrow because he explains them as increases and decreases in our power respectively. Desire doesn't fit this story so neatly. To begin with, desires appear to have a different direction of fit between the mind and the world. Desires have a world-to-mind direction of fit; in other words, desires are satisfied when the world is changed to match the desire. It is unclear how such mental states are supposed to function like joy and sorrow in reporting on our power because reports have the opposite direction of fit; reports are satisfied when they change to describe the world accurately. It is also unclear how desires fit into Youpa's reading. This is because he supposes that the emotions are supposed to provide axiological information, whereas he frequently argues that desires do not report on the value of things (65) in the course of arguing against anti-realist views. Finally, it is unclear how Youpa's reading would explain the metaphysics of desires. His reading holds that good and bad are power enhancements and impairments that do not depend on our desires, which suggests that desires must be separate from our power. How, then, should we locate them in Spinoza's ontology of the mind?

The second subject is the dictates of reason. These appear to be an important part of Spinoza's ethics. He claims that "acting absolutely from virtue" amounts to following the dictates of reason (4p24). A dictate of reason is the source of Spinoza's claim that we should act for the good of others, which is the basis for nobility. A dictate of reason is also the source of Spinoza's famously puzzling claim that a free person would never lie, not even to save her own life. The dictates of reason are hardly mentioned by Youpa, and it is unclear how they fit into his reading, particularly his notion that Spinoza assigns notions of accountability to the state and political life, rather than ethics (3-4). Don't ethical dictates create a kind of ethical accountability in the sense of telling us how we are supposed to act? Youpa argues that Spinoza's ethics eschews accountability in favor of offering a model or a picture of a good life. But if the dictates of reason only provide a model or picture of a good life, then how is Spinoza entitled to describe them as dictates, in other words, how do they dictate or command us to act?

In closing, Youpa's book provides an important rejoinder to the common tendency for Spinoza scholars to assume that Spinoza's primary ethical interest is to refute or debunk ethics as some kind of illusion. It makes an indispensable contribution to the growing literature on the subject, and it charts a path for future research by raising important new topics and questions.

[1] Spinoza's Ethics is cited by part and proposition, as is standard. This translation is from Edwin Curley, The Collected Works of Spinoza, volume 1, New Jersey: Princeton University Press, p. 484.