The Ethics of Need: Agency, Dignity, and Obligation

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Sarah Clark Miller, The Ethics of Need: Agency, Dignity, and Obligation, Routledge, 2012, 186pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415882682.

Reviewed by Grace Clement, Salisbury University


In this book, Sarah Clark Miller develops and defends an approach to ethics centered on the concept of need. She argues for the moral significance of fundamental needs, defined as those needs that must be met for a person to be an agent. This leads to a thorough account of needs, distinguishing needs from desires and distinguishing among various categories of needs (normative vs. non-normative, derivative vs. non-derivative, episodic vs. persistent, expressed vs. inferred, etc.). Miller also defends an "expanded" account of agency, arguing that agency, defined as the ability to carry out effective action in the world, requires not just rational autonomy, as philosophers have often held; it requires in addition emotional and relational abilities. With these definitions in place, Miller makes her central argument that we are morally obligated to respond to fundamental needs: we have a duty to care.

The conclusion that we have a duty to care draws upon both Kantian ethics and care ethics, and, indeed, Miller makes the case for what she calls a "pairing" or "hybrid" of Kantian ethics and feminist care ethics. She argues that Kantian ethics, and specifically the Kantian account of the duty of beneficence, provides the moral foundation for the obligation to care. Yet, on her view, Kantian ethics fails to show the content of this duty of beneficence. On the other hand, care ethics reveals the content of this obligation and the manner in which it is to be carried out, which Miller develops with an account of "dignifying care," or care that fosters the dignity of those in need. Yet care ethics, she holds, fails to provide a foundation for this duty, as it begins with the empirical observation that some people do care rather than addressing the fundamental moral question of whether and why everyone must care. Thus, in Miller's view, a combination of Kantian ethics and care ethics is necessary to provide a complete account of the duty to care.

After addressing the moral basis of the duty to care, Miller goes on to examine the practice of care in some particular situations and to explore some of the practical issues that arise in interpreting the ethics of need. Given the emphasis on agency in this account, questions arise about the duty to care for those at the "margins of agency," such as the elderly. Miller examines the duty to care for elderly parents and the implications of the duty to care with regard to health care resources for the elderly, showing, among other things, the sexism involved in rationing healthcare resources for the elderly. Given the ethic of care's emphasis on personal relations, questions also arise about the duty to care for distant others. Miller holds that distance is not a morally relevant factor and argues for "cosmopolitan care," a duty to care that can be both global and concrete in its respect for local understandings of care. In her final chapter, Miller identifies three areas for future research in thinking through the duty to care and the ethics of need: care in the public (or institutional) sphere, care for non-agential humans, and care for non-human animals.

This book is well-informed by the relevant literature and insightful in the ways it draws upon and extends recent work in Kantian ethics and feminist care ethics. The focus on needs is welcome, and the attempt to find a "hybrid" of Kantian ethics and care ethics is appropriate given the competing roles these two approaches have played in recent related moral discussions. Miller is well-aware that advocates of Kantian ethics and advocates of feminist care ethics are likely to be skeptical of this pairing, and she responds effectively to some of their likely concerns. Yet there are some fundamental differences between Kantian ethics and care ethics that may stand in the way of "pairing" the two ethics in a way that respects what is essential and valuable in each. In particular, the attempt to find an ethic of care in Kantian ethics seems to overlook or minimize important features of the ethic of care.

We can see this, first, with respect to the role of reciprocity in morality. Kant focuses on individuals who are equal in morally relevant respects, such that we have moral duties (only) to others who have the same moral duties to us. The ethics of care, in contrast, begins with a recognition of inequality and non-reciprocity in many morally significant relationships. Miller follows Kant when she argues that the reason we have a duty to care for others is that we humans are interdependent: we require the help of one another to meet our fundamental needs. Appealing to Kant's argument for the duty of beneficence, Miller holds that a principle of indifference to the needs of others could be maintained without contradiction, but that such a principle would contradict the will of a finite, interdependent human to continue existing. "In light of this finitude and interdependence, and because rational beings, as rational, will their own continued existence, finite rational beings must help one another in cases of need as they practice the duty to care" (55). Note that the basis for this duty to care -- interdependence -- is a characteristic we all have in common. We have a duty to care for all humans because all humans are interdependent.

As Miller recognizes, her ethics of need does not easily include those individuals who have little or no agency. She says that we therefore need a different account of the moral considerability of such individuals (rather than that such individuals lack moral considerability, as Kant would say). But perhaps this different account is the ethic of care. In any case, such cases have led care ethicists to reject the premise of reciprocity: some crucial yet traditionally overlooked parts of morality are not reciprocal but take place between beings who are unequal in fundamental ways. Yes, we are all dependent upon the care of some others, but we are not all equally dependent, nor are we all equally able to provide such care. Some people are much more vulnerable and needy than others, and it is a crucial insight of the ethic of care that we have special responsibilities to those who are especially vulnerable and needy. For this reason, care ethicists have sometimes argued that the basis for our care responsibilities is vulnerability, a characteristic that is not shared equally among all. Miller rejects vulnerability as the foundation for the duty to care. She doesn't explain why here, but this rejection makes sense if morality is regarded as fundamentally reciprocal.

On the other hand, Miller seeks to make her ethics of need more inclusive than Kantian ethics by defending what she calls an expanded account of agency. She says that agency is "more than what philosophers have frequently taken it to be" (24). It extends beyond rationality and autonomy and includes emotionality and relationality. It is not entirely clear whether this results in a more or a less inclusive account of agency: Is the point that one must not only be rational, but also emotional to be an agent? In that case, then rationality is still necessary, but is not sufficient for agency. Or is the point that rationality is not necessary for agency? It seems that Miller aims for a more inclusive notion of agency. She writes, for instance, "Agents lacking full rational agency may, in fact, exceed other predominantly rational agents in their emotional or relational powers of agency" (25). This, of course, is a significant departure from Kantian ethics, according to which rational agency is central. Yet it retains the Kantian emphasis on reciprocity: agency may be re-defined, but still we have the duty to care only for other agents, and not for non-agents.

We see the continued emphasis on reciprocity in the discussion of whether we have a duty to care for non-human animals. According to Miller, whether we have a duty to care for non-human animals depends upon whether those animals possess a variant of the moral power to care. That is, to be obligated to care for them, they must be carers themselves. But, again, a key insight of the ethic of care is that reciprocity, or equality in respect of the morally relevant feature, should not be assumed. We may have responsibilities to care for animals who are not themselves able to care, at least in any way recognizable to us.

Thus, two of the areas that Miller identifies as important for future research -- care for non-agential humans and care for non-humans -- might more appropriately be seen as central to understanding our duty to care. It is at least questionable whether an ethic of care can be based on reciprocity, as a Kantian approach would require.

A similar issue may arise with regard to the third area Miller identifies for future research, care in the public sphere. That is, it might be argued that the possibility and the nature of institutional care is a central concern, not one that can be set aside for future consideration. It is central because it raises defining questions about the ethic of care -- the role of feeling in care and the relationship between the realms of care and justice.

As Miller notes, care ethicists may resist the notion of a duty to care, preferring that care arise out of affection within personal relations. However, as Miller argues, without the notion of a duty to care, care will become the burden of those with particular emotional predispositions, or of those assumed to have them, such as women. Following the care ethicist Nel Noddings, Miller distinguishes between natural caring and ethical caring: when caring feelings do not arise naturally or spontaneously, we can summon ethical caring and act based on a principle of care. Yet Miller departs from Noddings and care ethics in her interpretation of the significance of this distinction. With Kant, Miller focuses on the fact that we cannot be morally obligated to feel a certain way; what she overlooks or minimizes is that, despite this fact, feeling a certain way still has moral significance. This may be why care ethicists de-emphasize the place of obligation in ethics, and why care ethics is better understood as a kind of virtue ethics than as a kind of deontology. Miller is certainly right that we have obligations beyond what we feel inclined to do, but that does not justify the claim that the moral significance of caring is not connected to feeling.

Care ethicists have also focused on particular responsibilities arising out of particular relationships rather than universal obligations to all humans. Of course, we are interdependent, but we rely on the care of particular others, and from a care perspective it is hard to see how this fact can generate an obligation to care for all others. Miller writes, "The man of mutual indifference cannot will that he never help another because willing thusly amounts to willing his own possible downfall and destruction" (56). But of course the question is not whether we should never help another; it is whether we have a general duty to care for those in need, or whether instead we have particular duties to care for others. It is arguably part of the essence of care that it is selective, rather than all or nothing, as Kant would have it. This need not mean that we have no obligations beyond this selective care; it might better be interpreted as meaning that beyond our selective responsibilities of care we have general obligations of justice. Kantian ethics may account well for our obligations of justice; but it remains at least questionable whether it can account for what is important in an ethic of care.

Another reason to distinguish care from justice concerns the moral significance of distance. If distance has no moral significance, as Miller claims, are we obligated to all needy beings anywhere in the universe? If, as Miller says in the introduction, we are faced with infinite need (2), then there is more need than we can possibly meet. This means that we must have some way of distinguishing between the obligatory and what is good but not morally obligatory. The ethic of care provides a way of making this distinction. Perhaps care should not be limited to the realm of personal relations, but it is clear that we cannot be obligated to care for everyone equally.

It is hard to escape the conclusion that in creating a hybrid of care ethics and Kantian ethics, we will lose some important features of one or the other ethic. Certain aspects of care ethics can find support in Kantian ethics, but others, including aspects that are valuable in thinking about the ethics of need, cannot. Miller is clearly correct when she says we should bring Kantian and care ethics into conversation with one another. But I suspect this is because they have different things to say, rather than because they can be understood as saying the same thing.

As I hope I have conveyed here, this is a thought-provoking book. It takes positions that arise out of recent discussions of the ethic of care and defends them in careful and thorough ways that make these positions available for the attention and scrutiny they deserve. Whether or not one is fully persuaded by this account, anyone interested in the possibilities of an ethics of need will benefit from reading it.