The Ethics of Nonviolence: Essays by Robert L. Holmes

Placeholder book cover

Robert L. Holmes, The Ethics of Nonviolence: Essays by Robert L. Holmes, Predrag Cicovacki (ed.), Bloomsbury, 2013, 263pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781623568054.

Reviewed by Andrew Fiala, California State University, Fresno


This is a collection of essays by Robert L. Holmes, a philosopher known primarily for his extensive body of work on nonviolence and war, including his influential book, On War and Morality (Princeton University Press, 1989). The essays include some of Holmes' early articles on American pragmatism and ethical theory. But its primary focus is later work, including some important material on the philosophy of nonviolence (some of it published previously in journals and books along with some previously unpublished material). The book concludes with a short essay on Holmes' teaching philosophy and an interview with the editor that provides some biographical material about Holmes' education and life.

While the earlier essays on pragmatism and ethical theory may be of interest to academic philosophers, and the later items would be of interest to those who know Holmes as a teacher or colleague, the primary focus of the volume is on the ethics of nonviolence. The essays on this topic are both readable and important. They would be of interest to a broad audience and not merely to academic philosophers. Indeed, these essays should be read and carefully considered by students of peace studies and peace activists.

One significant contribution is Holmes' is analysis of the difference between nonviolentism and pacifism. Indeed, it appears that he coined the term "nonviolentism" in a 1971 essay that is reprinted in this collection (157). According to Holmes, pacifism is a narrow perspective that is merely opposed to war, while nonviolentism is a broader perspective that is opposed in general to violence.

Holmes' account is a fine piece of analytic philosophy that reminds us that conceptual analysis matters. One concrete outcome of his analysis is the idea that one need not be an absolutist to be a pacifist or a nonviolentist. According Holmes, pacifists and nonviolentists get painted into a conceptual corner when they are thought to be absolutists. Absolute nonviolentism is easily overcome by imagined thought experiments in which a minor amount of violence is necessary in order to save a large number of people. Holmes concedes this point, admitting that absolute pacifism is "clearly untenable" (158).

Holmes' admission that pacifism is not appropriate for all conceivable worlds and in any conceivable circumstance may appear to doom his effort to defend nonviolence. And some may object that once Holmes makes this concession, continued discussion of nonviolentism becomes moot. Why bother to discuss nonviolentism when it won't work for the really hard cases?

But in fact, his admission of the limits of absolute moralizing is interesting as a meta-philosophical thesis, as a comment about absolutism in philosophy. And it links to his understanding of nonviolence as a way of life. Holmes connects the idea of nonviolence as a way of life with the tradition of virtue ethics -- and with non-Western sources such as Taoism. Holmes' goal is to describe a way of life in which nonviolence governs all of life, including both thought and deed.

Nonviolence in this maximalist sense does govern all of our life. Once we satisfy its requirements, we may in other respects act as we choose toward others. Even though I have stated it negatively, it has, for all practical purposes, a positive content. It tells us to be nonviolent. (174)

This is somewhat vague. A critic may worry -- as critics of virtue ethics often do -- that this is not very helpful when considering concrete cases. Such a retreat to virtue may not be readily accepted by absolutists who want clarity about moral principles. But Holmes fends of this sort of critique in his theoretical essays. In an essay with the polemical title "The Limited Relevance of Analytical Ethics to the Problems of Bioethics," Holmes aims to show that analytic ethics fails in important ways. In general Holmes holds that moral philosophy is situated in a broader context in which philosophers come to their work with a set of predispositions that are apparent even in the choice of methodology. And he points to a gap between the way philosophers proceed and the way the vast majority of people proceed, when reflecting on moral issues. What most of us want is a way of life and system of virtue -- not merely a decision procedure based on abstract principles.

This leads Holmes to conclude that academic philosophy is not very good at creating moral wisdom. Moral philosophizing attempts to hover free from value claims -- in attempting to be neutral -- and thus can end up being used to support immoral outcomes. A related point is made in Holmes' broader claim about the way that universities are too cozy with the military-industrial complex -- for example in supporting ROTC programs. While his criticism of ROTC was made in the early 1970's, we might note that ROTC still exists on campuses across the country, often free from criticism. It is worth considering whether the values embodied in academic philosophy and the larger academy are nonviolentist in Holmes' sense.

In the metaphilosophical and metaethical concerns of the earlier essays, Holmes clarifies the source of his thinking in American pragmatism (with special emphasis on Dewey). He also discusses the problem of finding a middle path between consequentialist and nonconsequentialist moral theory. And he criticizes philosophers' tendency to rely on imagined thought experiments.

He explains, for example, that most people are simply not absolutists, who hold to principles in the face of all possible counter-examples. He writes that although some philosophers believe that "far-fetched counterexamples" may crushingly refute absolute principles, "the philosopher's refutation of the philosopher's interpretation of the principle becomes conspicuously irrelevant to the issues in which ordinary people find themselves caught up" (57). Holmes' immediate target here is moral reasoning that occurs in applied ethics -- specifically Judith Thomson's widely read 1971 article "In Defense of Abortion." Holmes aims beyond the postulation of absolutist principles and attempted refutations of these by imagined counter-examples.

The imagined examples that are offered to refute pacifism are, for the most part irrelevant to Holmes' endeavor of describing and defending an ethic of nonviolence. He rejects an exclusive focus on "contrived cases, such as that of a solitary Gandhi assuming the lotus position before an attacking Nazi panzer division" (146). Holmes admits that killing could be justified in some rare situations. But such an admission does not help us make moral judgments in the real world of war and militarism. I think he is right about this. But one might worry that Holmes does not offer enough analysis of the concrete and ugly reality of war. For example, there is no discussion of post-traumatic stress disorder or suicide by soldiers or fragging -- let alone an account of war on children, widows, and the social fabric. Indeed, there is little here in terms of descriptions of the ugly reality of war that is often left out by defenders of militarism. Holmes may imagine that we already know that ugly reality. But his argument could be bolstered by more concrete detail.

One significant point Holmes makes is that much of the evil of the world -- and especially the evil of war -- is not deliberately intended. Holmes rejects the doctrine of double effect by noting that an exclusive focus on intention is insufficient. But he points toward a larger problem, which he names "the Paradox of Evil": "the greatest evils in the world are done by basically good people" (209). Truly evil people are usually only able to harm a few others. But the greatest harms are done by large social organizations that use good people to create massive suffering. Holmes suggests that the worst things happen when basically good people end up sacrificing for and supporting political and military systems. One reason for this is that they have been persuaded that nonviolentism is silly -- by those pernicious and fallacious arguments that consist primarily of contrived imagined cases.

Rather than dwelling on those contrived cases, Holmes emphasizes that we ought to work to develop plausible alternatives to violence and war. He imagines a nonviolent army or peaceforce, consisting of tens of thousands of trained persons, funded and educated at levels equivalent to that of the military. While it may seem that "nonviolent social defense" (as Holmes prefers to call it) is feckless in a world of military power, Holmes points out that there have been successful cases of nonviolent social transformation in recent history: in the Indian campaign for independence from Britain, in the American Civil Rights movement, in the demise of the Soviet Union, and in the end of apartheid in South Africa. This is all useful as a reminder of the fact that nonviolence can work. But one thing missing here is a concrete analysis of how and why nonviolent social revolutions work.

Holmes does argue that in order to complete the work of creating a "nonviolent American revolution" as he puts it, we ought to leave our violentist/realist assumptions about history behind and acknowledge that nonviolence can work to produce positive social change. For example, Holmes points out that national economies are grounded in value judgments and that we could create a nonviolent national economy, rather than our current militarized economy.

This points toward Holmes' basic optimism and idealism. Holmes suggest that our world is based in thought: "much of the world that most of us live in consists of embodied thought" (233). Injustices such as slavery are grounded upon a set of values and concepts that could be otherwise. One of the problems of the ubiquity of militarism in the United States is the feeling that military power is inevitable and normal. But Holmes points out that things could be different -- that we could imagine the social and political world differently and reconstitute it accordingly.

One significant problem is that we are miseducated about the usefulness of violence. Prevailing historical narratives make it appear that progress is usually made by the use of military power. But Holmes is at pains to point out that war and violence have often not worked. "We know that resort to war and violence for all of recorded history has not worked. It has not secured either peace or justice to the world" (197). While we often hear a story touting the usefulness of violence -- as in the Second World War narrative -- it turns out that in reality war merely prepares the way for future conflict -- as the Second World War gave way to the Cold War.

A further problem is that Holmes thinks that we defer too willingly to the narratives told by those in power and that we are too quick to give our loyalty to the state. Holmes espouses loyalty to the truth -- not loyalty to the state -- and a higher patriotism that is directed beyond borders. "It is from love of one's country, and for humankind generally, that a nonviolent transformation of society must proceed" (232). Running throughout his essays is a sort of anarchism, which Holmes sees in the ideas of those authors he admires: Thoreau, Tolstoy, and Gandhi. Holmes concludes, "the consistent and thoroughgoing nonviolentist, as Tolstoy saw, will be an anarchist" (180). To support this idea, Holmes reminds us that there is nothing permanent or sacred about the system of nation-states. "Nation-states are not part of the nature of things. They certainly are not sacrosanct. If they perpetuate ways of thinking that foster division and enmity among peoples, ways should be sought to transcend them" (120).

The just war tradition and political realism appear to go astray when they turn the state into an end in itself, rather than viewing it as a means to be used to create positive social living. Holmes locates one source of this in Augustine, who compromised so much with state power that he ended up closer to Hobbes than to Jesus -- a line of political realism that Holmes claims is picked up by Reinhold Niebuhr.

This train of thought points toward a critique of the logic of militaristic nation-states, which will tend to grow in power and centralized control. This leads to what Holmes calls the "garrison mentality" and "the garrison state" (114). He maintains that under the guise of a realist interpretation of history we end up assimilating military values, thinking that we can solve both international and domestic problems through the use of military tactics. But the development of the garrison state chained to a permanent war economy is an impending disaster, especially in a democracy. Holmes suggests, "This most likely would not happen by design, but gradually, almost imperceptibly, through prolonged breathing of the air of militarism, deceptively scented by the language of democratic values" (114). But in the long run, the growth of militarism comes at the expense of democracy. These prescient ideas were originally published in 1998, prior to 9/11, the war on terrorism, and recent revelations about the growing extent of security agencies and spying. The perceptive insight of Holmes' remarks reminds us that the perspective of nonviolentism is a valuable one, which helps to provide a critical lens on the world.

In general, this book provides a useful collection of essays on the ethics of nonviolence. Some of the earlier essays can be seen as a bit academic and boring. But, as noted above, the metaphilosophical considerations found in these earlier essays are clearly connected to the more concrete considerations on the ethics and philosophy of nonviolence. If one thing is missing, it is a more extensive practical account of how and why nonviolence works. Holmes mentions that some of the evidence for his claims about the effectiveness of nonviolence can be found in the work of authors such as Gene Sharp. However, there are very few details. Nor is there much in terms of a description of what a nonviolent way of life would look like. Would it be vegetarian? Would it include religion? Would a nonviolentist play violent video games or films? How would nonviolence impact gender relations? Would a nonviolentist with anarchist sympathies such as Holmes retreat to a 21st century version of Walden Pond? Or would nonviolence lead us to a life of activism and social protest? One hopes that Holmes may take up the practical particulars of a life of nonviolence in future work.