The Ethics of Parenthood

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Norvin Richards, The Ethics of Parenthood, Oxford University Press, 2010, 295pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199731749.

Reviewed by Michael W. Austin, Eastern Kentucky University


Much contemporary work in the philosophy of the family is focused on some particular aspect of parenthood, such as the ethics of reproductive technologies. In contrast to this, Norvin Richards offers a wide-ranging analysis of several important moral aspects of the parent-child relationship from, as the book's inside flap puts it, "slightly before the cradle to slightly before the grave." The Ethics of Parenthood is one of the few more comprehensive treatments of the ethical dimensions of the parent-child relationship. The book's first section, comprising the first four chapters, contains an examination of the significance of biological parenthood and what it is that grounds someone's claim to be a parent of a particular child. The second section, composed of five chapters, focuses on the obligations of parents and includes such topics as the autonomy of children, moral education, and love's import within the parent-child relationship. The final three chapters focus on the relationship between adult children and their parents, and what it means to be a good mother or father and good son or daughter during this phase of the relationship. The conclusion is a précis of the book, and as such would be useful for those looking for a comprehensive overview of the issues considered and the positions defended within its pages.

The Ethics of Parenthood has several virtues. First, it is clearly written and argued. Second, it includes critical reflection upon our commonsense beliefs about the parent-child relationship in a way that is sensitive to the realities of family life. Third, it includes a discussion of a variety of actual cases, some very well-known (Baby Jessica, Kimberly Mays) and some that are less so. Richards explores the theoretical implications of the cases and the implications of his theory for the cases themselves. Finally, for Richards, when there is a conflict concerning the rights and obligations of parents and children, no single person or entity trumps the others. Rather, as he elucidates his theoretical views and explores their practical implications, the interests of all of the relevant parties are taken into consideration, with no single party's interests -- the parent, the child, society, and the state -- necessarily trumping the relevant interests of the others regardless of the context.

In his discussion of parental rights, Richards rightly rejects accounts of parental rights grounded in the view that children are somehow the property of their parents, as well as a version of the best interests of the child account which takes the child's interests to be the only interests in play or to trump the interests of others. On the view defended by Richards, parental rights are grounded in the right to continue with whatever we already have underway, as long as it does no harm to others. While parenthood can bring forms of harm into being, he argues that in normal parenting the harms done are insufficient for the forfeiture of parental rights. What counts as continuing with the project of parenthood? According to Richards, this includes meeting the physical and emotional needs of children, deciding where the child lives and what manner of discipline to employ, providing moral and religious education, providing education and skills beyond a minimum standard, and raising the child to become a particular type of functional adult via parental influence. At least for cultures in which this is what parenthood is, these are the rights of parents.

Richards argues that there are ways to begin the project of parenthood which generate parental rights and ways which do not. First, as long as a person becomes a parent without violating anyone else's rights, then that person has the moral standing of being a parent. This can occur via biological processes, adoption, and other more informal means. A rapist does not acquire such rights, because he has violated the rights of the mother by his actions. Cases of assisted reproduction are also discussed, and Richards claims that the important question with respect to motherhood is which woman has the project of parenthood underway. For him, this depends on who starts the process with respect to biology. This is the question, not who the biological mother properly is. For example, in the case of surrogacy, it is the contracting mother who starts the process that is the child's parent, not the genetic surrogate. Richards also argues that since commercial surrogacy does not violate the rights of the surrogate, it is a suitable way to have a child and acquire parental rights.

However, on this particular subject, Richards is mistaken. It is arguably the case that commercial surrogate motherhood constitutes baby-selling, given the structure of surrogacy contracts with respect to the transfer of parental rights (see Scott Rae, The Ethics of Commercial Surrogate Motherhood, Praeger, 1993). If it is true that commercial surrogacy is the selling of a human being, then the rights of the infant are violated and commercial surrogacy is not a legitimate way to acquire the moral standing of being a parent, if, as Richards argues, the acquisition of such standing is contingent upon not violating the rights of another. This objection does not undermine the general account of parental rights given by Richards, but rather is meant to show that there is a violation of rights in commercial surrogacy which he ought to consider when discussing the implications of his general account for particular cases.

There are two other conditions for possessing parental rights if someone has begun to parent a child, in addition to not violating the rights of anyone else. One must be capable of continuing to be the parent of the child in question, and there must be no compelling evidence that one will not capably function as the parent of that child. These rights are not inalienable, however, and if a parent abuses or neglects a child, his or her parental rights can be suspended or terminated. The state is justified in such actions when parents fail to fulfill the special obligations of parenthood, which include the current and future welfare of the child. More specifically (and somewhat conservatively), Richards argues that

what calls most urgently for rescue by the state is life with a parent who is seriously defective in concern. The compelling signs that this is the life of a particular child … are (1) failures to treat the child as well as even a stranger should, where these cannot be dismissed as trivial or as being within parental latitude, (2) convincing evidence of a mental or psychological condition that would render the parent unable to implement the concern that parenthood requires, or (3) sustained and extensive failures in distinctively parental obligations (p. 110).

There is a shortcoming in this first section of the book worth noting. While I find myself largely in agreement with much of what Richards argues, others may not be so inclined. I think his argument could be strengthened by a deeper engagement with some of the philosophical literature that deals with the value of biology for parenthood specifically and the other accounts of parental rights more generally. Those with less conventional views about the basis of parental rights might be skeptical of the significant role biology plays in commonsense views of parenthood. And although Richards does not defend a strictly biological view of parenthood, those who are social constructivists with respect to the family and parental rights might require more in the way of argument for the view that beginning the project of parenthood via sexual reproduction, with the appropriate qualifications, is sufficient for parental rights.

The second section of the book examines what is morally required of parents. In chapter 5, Richards considers the issue of autonomy and the obligations of parents and their children as they relate to it. He argues that children's autonomy ought to be respected, even when they are young, though parents can be justified in protecting them and acting in paternalist ways in order to do so. As a child grows and matures and begins to have a self of his or her own, the range of choices to be honored increases because they express this self.

Chapter 6 includes an examination of what it is that parents are obligated to try to accomplish as they raise a child to become an adult. According to Richards, parents are obligated to raise their child to be morally good and to have a life that he or she is reasonably happy with that serves his or her particular desires reasonably well.

In chapter 7, Richards argues that parents are obligated to ensure that their children develop empathy, a sense of fairness, and a sense of responsibility for their own actions because these are necessary traits for living in society with other people. Parents should also foster a Millian ability of being capable of improvement via free and equal discussion, and an Aristotelian capacity for friendships of mutual value, trust, and loyalty. Beyond these, there are no other virtues which all parents should seek to inculcate in their children, because there are many ways of being more than morally decent, and the child should participate in the process of determining which of these ways to pursue.

Chapter 8 addresses how to deal with the bad behavior of children and includes the claim that good parents will use bad behavior as a way to foster the moral education of the child. Finally, chapter 9 contains a discussion of whether or not parents and children have an obligation to love one another.

In the book's final section, chapters 10-12, Richards examines the moral relationship between parents and children once the children are grown. At this stage in the relationship, grown children are now responsible for their moral character, and there are more restrictions on how parents may seek to influence that character as well as the overall shape of the lives of those children. The commitments to one another that good parents and children have continue into adulthood, but they change in important ways. One question discussed in this final section is this: what special obligations do grown children have to their parents? The answer depends in part on the nature of the relationship before the children were grown. More specifically, Richards argues that grown children are obligated to give their parents a place in their affections that is roughly equivalent to the place those parents gave them when they were young. These duties are not necessarily permanent, but they include such things as spending time with the parent, doing things he or she enjoys occasionally, and being of help in a variety of ways. The final chapter includes an examination of whether and when we should permit a loved one to make a great sacrifice on our behalf. An elderly or seriously ill parent might allow his child to make great sacrifices on his behalf as a way of respecting her autonomy and recognizing the love that exists between them which can impart great value to making such sacrifices for a loved parent.

In conclusion, there are other ethical issues in the parent-child relationship -- both theoretical and practical -- that I wish Richards had either specifically or more deeply addressed. For example, what sort of discipline of children is morally appropriate? Is the religious upbringing of children to be approached in the same way as the moral education of children, or is there something special about the former which requires a revised approach? What moral considerations are in play concerning the educational choices of parents on behalf of their children, including homeschooling? More theoretically, is the family merely a social construct, or does it also have some sort of deeper ontological status? These points are not intended to be criticisms of the book, as no single volume addressing the parent-child relationship could be fully comprehensive. And while it would be interesting to read what Richards believes about these particular issues, one could draw upon the arguments he has offered in the book to develop views on these and other issues in the parent-child relationship. For those interested in considering such issues in particular and the moral dimensions of the parent-child relationship more broadly, I highly recommend a close reading of The Ethics of Parenthood.