The Ethics of Patriotism: A Debate

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John Kleinig, Simon Keller, and Igor Primoratz, The Ethics of Patriotism: A Debate, Wiley-Blackwell, 2015, 189pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780470658857.

Reviewed by Jill Hernandez, University of Texas at San Antonio


Within the landscape of global terror and amidst the necessary philosophical dialogue about the ethics and scope of just war, it can be difficult to remember that many real-world people across the globe believe they have a patriotic duty to take up arms for their country. But providing a useful definition of patriotism and a moral defense of it can prove to be just as difficult.

The earlier scholarship of the interlocutors in The Ethics of Patriotism already demonstrates that they are up to the challenge, and their latest contributions offer insight into the complexities of the morally relevant considerations that frame the debate surrounding the permissibility of patriotism. John Kleinig's reputation as a scholar who deftly explains complex applied issues in security ethics positions him well to address how patriotism might be conceived as a virtue -- but one that could potentially be corrupted by the vicious. If, indeed, patriotism entails some version of loyalty, then Simon Keller -- whose interesting (and renowned) work denies that loyalty is a virtue -- sets him up as a natural critic of Kleinig's view. A middle position is given by Igor Primoratz, who has made a distinguished career of defending a version of ethical patriotism which he explains further here. Although much of the the initial essays' contents have been articulated elsewhere by the authors, in this volume they each take pains in the middle section to truly engage with the other scholars' arguments. The result is that the "Debate" promised in the title is delivered at least as a "Dialogue", which culminates in a short final section in which each author summarizes his own view, the criticisms of it offered in the other authors' initial essays, and his replies to those criticisms.

This dialogue begins with an explanation of what the authors actually agree on -- which turns out to be (surprisingly) some very important things. They all believe that patriotism conceptually must involve an agent's love for a country rather than for a people group (4). (The latter affect is identified as "nationalism" as opposed to patriotism, and throughout the authors are careful to both separate the two and also to remind the reader how difficult it really is to separate them.) Collectively, the authors agree also that if an agent is a patriot, then she favors her country over others, which they argue indicates that given "the right circumstances, the patriot will do things for her country that she would not do for other countries" (5), including performing actions to protect the country's defense, health, and prosperity. Finally, they think that being a patriot means that an agent's self-conception integrates a patriotic identification with her country in a way that impacts how others view her character (5). The patriot identifies with her country in relational terms: her country is hers, and the reciprocal obligations between country and patriot matter morally. The disagreements that emerge out of these agreements fuel the book's content and include questions about the nature and scope of patriotic actions, the moral permissibility of identifying with a country, the value of patriotism, and even whether one could be a patriot without also being a scoundrel.

Part One clearly demarcates the distinctive features of the authors' previous work and sets up the interesting dialogue function of Part Two. Kleinig's view is laid out first. He argues that, all things being equal, a country is an associative object (regardless of whether it is loved for its own sake or instrumentally, 24) that may be justified in demanding our patriotic commitment (35). When we have a dispositional attitude to behave towards an associative object with which we identify, we exhibit loyalty. And, although this loyalty is subject to corruption (and so may be exploited by a country's government towards its own morally nefarious purposes), as long as agents are aware of patriotism's potential susceptibility, they can be patriotic in a virtuous way (36). Since whether patriotism becomes a virtue or vice depends in part on whether the agent is able to spatially delineate between nationalism and patriotism and take the best bits of each (42), the moral justification of patriotism is tied to agential volition, and so not every version of patriotism is imbued with bad faith.

Keller argues differently. Patriotism rests on a particular positive picture an agent has of the country, not just on the agent's positive belief that the country conforms to some positive picture (169), with the result that patriotism is fundamentally, constitutionally flawed. Patriotism cannot function as a virtue (contra Kleinig) because it is intertwined with bad faith (164) and motivates agents to hide displeasing truths about the country to which they are patriotic or to present ugly truths about it as pleasing untruths (35). Keller worries that governments take advantage of the patriot's willingness to be deceived, and more, that the patriot's participation in institutional deception is glossed with a veneer of moral permissibility when the patriot 'spins' as true whatever evidence is at her disposal in order to maintain an image of what her country should be. (Americans who continue to justify the invasion of Iraq because they believe the evidence suggests there could have been weapons of mass destruction in Iraq would fall into this category.) Keller thinks that advocates of patriotism can only at best tell us that we cannot know if patriotism is required for a state to flourish, and if we cannot know if it is required then we need not conclude that it is. Indeed, there might be examples of countries that had success without widespread patriotic feeling (see West Germany in the late twentieth-century). But, intrepid fans of the Star Spangled Banner need not worry too much about Keller's rejection of the virtue of patriotism because although he cautions against the epistemic and moral pitfalls of patriotism, he wants to replace it with good citizenry (170).

Primoratz's middle position resides between Kleinig's contention that patriotism is not a vice and can be morally obligatory and Keller's view that patriotism is a vice that leads the agent to join in systemic deception and potential harm. His goal is to distinguish among cases in which "patriotism is morally unobjectionable and … [when] … it is morally required or virtuous" (83). He identifies the concern that agents have for a country's defense, health, and prosperity as "worldly patriotism" and the concern they have for a country to perform well in its laws and policies and to act rightly in relationships with other countries (without having the same feeling for those other countries) as "ethical patriotism" (5). Primoratz thinks that there are three main reasons to adopt ethical patriotism, or a patriotism that focuses on the country's moral record and the implementation of just and humane laws (176). First, ethical patriotism better positions agents to repair past injustices because agents are in a better position to know what laws and activities of their home country are unjust -- and patriots have a better chance of being heard by their governments when they argue against one of their government's practices (96). Second, and much stronger, ethical patriotism is morally mandatory for any citizen who tacitly benefits from a government's public policies. Finally, ethical patriotism ought to be adopted because we ought to "cultivate and exercise a special concern for the moral well-being of my country and compatriots" (98). Ultimately, Primoratz contends, the moral responsibility for a government's actions -- even if those actions are unjust -- falls on the citizenry of a country (99). If this is true, Primoratz's grounding for ethical patriotism becomes clearer: citizens ought to care and work to repair unjust action because if they do not, they are complicit in the actions of their government.

The volume provides an excellent and timely reminder as to some of the moral questions that weigh on how we identify with our country (of origin or residence), and a background knowledge of the authors' antecedent work is not required to follow the argument trajectories from the beginning. Dabblers in applied ethics will be disappointed by some obvious constraints of the book, including its diminutive size and its argumentation's correlatively thin scope. For example, the moral arguments are solely framed by either a virtue ethical or deontological background, and the authors do not really consider the question from consequentialist or intuitionist perspectives, which (to me) seem oddly excluded. (Igor Primoratz is the only author to address the possibility for a utilitarian argument, but he dismisses the potential for a successful utilitarian standpoint in two small statements: first, "Both the consequentialist argument and that of reciprocity present the patria as an association . . . . But- at least as the patriot sees it -- patria is something quite different: it is community," 90, and second, that "The special concern for the well-being of one's country and compatriots that is grounded in utility will be found much too tenuous by a patriot worth his salt. Nor is such concern part and parcel of citizenship" 73.) And, although the book need not exhaustively treat the moral issues involved in the ethics of patriotism, a utilitarian perspective is one of the most widely-represented views when it comes to justifying patriotic action. The state, for example, minimally seems to have strong utilitarian pragmatic reasons to want its citizens to be patriotic (including the need to secure stability and trust within and between nations, see Føllesdal 2000), and a number of scholars have argued for the stronger position that a citizenry ought to be patriotic for the utilitarian benefit reaped by the patriotism (Nathanson 2009).

But, there are deeper worries than its failure to connect with major moral theories. The primary difference between the writers really is not about what patriotism is or where it falls on the scope of what virtues are considered to be. Fundamentally, they disagree about the value of patriotism. Kleinig's view that loyalty to the state can be morally obligatory means that patriotism ought to have a positive moral value -- especially if it functions as a virtue. But much of the book is a morality play about the dangers that can come with attributing patriotism as a virtue. This worry conflates with the difficulty most writers on the topic have: just how can you preserve patriotism without preserving nationalism? These authors state at the beginning they just aren't talking about nationalism, but the equivocation between the concepts lurks in the background of the arguments. For example, when Primoratz responds to Keller's and Kleinig's criticism that 'ethical patriotism' really is 'collective responsibility' he replies that a "I can have a lively sense of collective responsibility in relation to many groups, large or small, but I can be an ethical patriot only when the collective is my patria" (176). While it is true that a patriot's moral obligations are to country, and so to patria, we do not mean that her moral obligations are to place. Rather, those moral obligations are to the state, as populated by people. So, the strict delineation between place and people that the authors want (20-21) is difficult to maintain when discussing what moral obligations patriots might have. If I think I have moral obligations to Texas, what I mean is that I have moral obligations to the people and, perhaps, institutions that are populated by people, within the state, and not to the land circumscribed as 'Texas'. Similarly, a patriot would have obligations to country only insofar as she has relationships within it. Interestingly, I think Primoratz would agree with me on the last point. Ethical patriotism only works if the obligations we have to rectify state policy are placed on agents because of action by a country's institution (decided upon by the people within that institution).

Finally, a main concern about the content of the book should be what it does not present -- namely, the strongest arguments against patriotism. The debate over whether patriotism is a virtue or a vice pales in comparison to the view that patriotism is morally abhorrent. (MacIntyre argued that the difference depended on whether someone viewed patriotism as merely a set of empty practical slogans or as potentially always in conflict with an impersonal moral standpoint, 1984, 6). Keller's articulation of patriotism as a vice that ought to be avoided in favor of good citizenship, for example, seems innocuous in comparison to some of the most vocal critics against patriotism. Among them, George Kateb argues that conceiving of patriotism as a vice is insufficient to prevent patriotic humans from participating in atrocities because the fact that something ought not morally be done has historically never been a good constraint on human action.

The horror is that hyperactive and inactive imagination (or moral blindness) in combination make it easy, or easier, to commit atrocities on a large scale and not feel regret or remorse, whether after victory or defeat. On every level, the participants have little or no conviction of vice (2006, 390).

Even if we as a citizenry were able to make incremental moral improvements, human nature does not change, and so "unchanged human nature … produces discontinuity in the scale of atrocious effects of deliberate state or movement policy, and could produce yet greater atrocities in the future, and even culminate in the extinction of humanity and much of nature" (387). And, for the debate within the book about the moral value of patriotism (whether extrinsic or intrinsic), comparatively, what value does patriotism have when it is grounded in loyalty to countries that facilitate "humanly inflicted and humanly endured catastrophes" and which deliberately perpetuate atrocities?


Andreas Føllesdal, "The Future Soul of Europe: Nationalism or Just Patriotism?", Journal of Peace Research, 37:4, July 2000, 503-518.

George Kateb, Patriotism and Other Mistakes, (Yale University Press), 2006.

Simon Keller, The Limits of Loyalty, (Cambridge University Press), 2007.

--  -- . "Patriotism as Bad Faith," Ethics, 115: 3, 2005, 563-592.

John Kleinig, "Patriotic Loyalty," in Patriotism: Philosophical and Political Perpsectives, Igor Primoratz and Aleksandar Pavković (editors), (Ashgate), 2008, 37-53.

Alasdair MacIntyre, Is Patriotism a Virtue? Lindley Lecture, University of Kansas, 1984.

Stephen Nathanson, "Patriotism, War, and the Limits of Permissible Partiality," The Journal of Ethics, 13:4, January 2009, 401-422.

Igor Primoratz, "Patriotism and the Value of Citizenship," Acta Analytica, 24:1, 2009, 63-67.

Igor Primoratz and Aleksandar Pavković (editors), Patriotism: Philosophical and Political Perspectives (Ashgate), 2008.