The Ethics of Pregnancy, Abortion and Childbirth: Exploring Moral Choices in Childbearing

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Helen Watt, The Ethics of Pregnancy, Abortion and Childbirth: Exploring Moral Choices in Childbearing, Routledge, 2016, 157pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138188082.

Reviewed by Amy Mullin, University of Toronto Mississauga


Helen Watt's book about moral choices connected to pregnancy is unusual in that it devotes relatively little space to discussing debates about the moral status of zygotes, embryos and fetuses. Watt gives sixteen pages of text (and another ten pages of footnotes) to arguing that zygotes (and also embryos and fetuses) have moral status equivalent to that of any human being. Key to her position is her contention that human beings, starting at conception, are beings of a rational kind with objective interests and her rejection of the notion that pregnant women confer meaning on some of their fetuses. She only briefly refers in a footnote to debates about speciesism (which contest the assignment of equal moral status to all members of the human species regardless of their own particular features and capacities). She argues against but does not engage in much detail with philosophical positions that discuss sentience and viability as important to moral status. For instance, there is no mention of Bonnie Steinbock's or Melinda Roberts' books about the moral status of embryos and fetuses. Watt's monograph should be read as primarily a philosophical articulation of her own views rather than a debate with positions that differ significantly from her own. From the moment of fertilization, Watt claims that what she terms unborn children have equal moral status to pregnant women, with equal rights to survival and bodily integrity.

While some readers will anticipate that Watt's position on the moral status of the fetus relies on religion (specifically an understanding of the zygote as possessing a human soul), and Watt does reference Catholic scholars fairly frequently, she does not use specifically religious concepts in her philosophical argumentation. Although she shares with many Catholic scholars a strong respect for what is natural as opposed to artificial, and a commitment to the view that fertilization is the point in a human's life when it begins to have full moral status, her articulation of her principles does not draw upon religion. In addition, she criticizes people who make unspecified objections to unnaturalness (114) and always has specific reasons for objecting to what she deems unnatural. Thus in her discussion of assisted reproductive technologies she raises a concern that couples employing these technologies do not unite during conception (117). Similarly, she has reservations about becoming pregnant via donor embryos because it can raise confusion about who the parents of a child are and she argues that it is a type of conception that can make a child feel less valued (112). While I do not agree with her positions (for instance I think that a couple could be more united in their joint project to achieve conception via technologies than in meaningless or disrespectful sexual intercourse), I appreciate that her views rely upon clearly articulated arguments.

Watt takes seriously the notion that pregnant women and fetuses have equal moral status in that she is concerned about the interests of pregnant women as well as fetuses. She is careful to note that childbearing burdens women far more than men (41) and argues that women experiencing difficult pregnancies have "serious claims to support from those around them." (67) She argues that it would be wrong to invade the body of a dying pregnant woman in a way that would kill her in order to save her child, even at the request of that woman (78). However, while she is concerned about pregnant women's interests, her focus is primarily on what she takes to be their objective interests -- rather than their subjective interests and their autonomy. Indeed, there is no reference in the index of her book to autonomy. While Watt devotes a page and a half to discussion of the right to control one's body, her main point in this discussion is that as important as a right to bodily integrity is, "there is no obvious case in which we are entitled to invade the body of another innocent human being in lethal ways to avoid supporting him or her." (46) Her concern for what she regards as women's objective interests sometimes appears to involve insufficient attention to what specific women actually want. For instance, she sees pregnancy as being inherently "a goal directed activity" even if it is unwanted (4) and speaks of women as being "psychophysically open" to becoming mothers when they have sex, even while she recognizes that women are not always literally or practically open in this way if one takes their desires into account (113).

Watt offers a thoughtful critique of what she terms consumerist attitudes towards children that she argues are encouraged by surrogacy and use of assisted reproductive technologies, but she contrasts a consumerist attitude only with one of unconditional love and commitment to an embryo and fetus. Although Watt argues only that "perhaps there is some value in the mother-child relationship beginning at least, however it matures" in a starkly unconditional way (81), she is willing to find removal of embryos in ectopic pregnancy (which can threaten a woman's health and life) morally problematic because they violate this unconditional commitment and hence an absolute duty to strive to nurture an unborn child (at least up to the point of viability). In a long footnote, she approvingly discusses Alexander Pruss' idea that a child needs to have experienced unconditional love (from the moment of conception) in order to develop properly and feel loved. She cites at length passages from his work that argue that if a woman even considers abortion (while ultimately deciding against it) or would potentially abort in some circumstances, then she has violated what should have been an unconditional commitment to her embryo or fetus (101). While a consumerist attitude toward one's child can be rightly condemned, presumably there are alternatives other than the absolutely unconditional commitment (beginning at fertilization) that Watt discusses.

While many books and articles about ethical issues connected with pregnancy discuss abortion, Watt's book also covers a range of topics connected to how children are conceived and gestated. She discusses ethical issues connected with prenatal testing, pregnancy and birth after rape, lethal fetal anomaly, pregnancy in comatose women, use of donor embryos, in vitro fertilization, ectopic pregnancies, and cancer during pregnancy. Given the fact that her book is fairly short, its range is quite broad. Readers will not find, however, any reference to female partners of pregnant women.

Also for a short monograph, a very considerable portion is devoted to notes, and much of her discussion of other thinkers is found in footnotes. While this approach has the advantage of making the book more accessible to readers less versed in philosophical debates, it can be somewhat frustrating to a reader more interested in the nuances of Watt's views. While she draws on a substantial bibliography, there are some scholars, besides those mentioned above, with whom I would have been interested to see her engage, such as Adrienne Asch and Rebecca Kukla. However, as mentioned earlier, Watt focuses more on engaging with scholars whose positions are closer to her own than those whose perspectives are farther apart. These include feminist writers, typically so long as the writers in question share some of her views, and also judge embryos and fetuses to have value in their own right.

Throughout the book there is very little discussion of the potential political implications of Watt's views. Given her view that a zygote is equivalent in moral status to an adult, and that it would be as morally wrong to damage or kill a fetus (even one whose presence is damaging its mother) as it would be to injure or kill an innocent adult unintentionally threatening one's life, we can expect her views to have implications for pregnant woman's rights and freedoms. In the US, the federal feticide law (The Unborn Victims of Violence Act of 2004) does not apply to any conduct of the pregnant woman. Would Watt endorse removing this exception?

While Watt tells us that she opposes forcible invasions of a woman to protect an embryo or fetus' interests, and suggests that she might endorse prohibiting what she terms harmful interventions, consensual or not, such as the morning after pill RU486 (68), it would be interesting to know more about how her moral values translate into political recommendations. Since she acknowledges that "aggressive measures to promote the child's welfare prenatally may deter some women from seeking prenatal care" (68-9), it is possible that she would not support taking political and legal measures to prohibit abortion and penalize failures to provide the best prenatal environment, but this is territory that she leaves largely unexplored in this book.

In summary, Watt's monograph will be of most interest to readers interested in a brief, wide ranging coverage of topics of moral significance connected with conception, pregnancy and childbirth that articulates a point of view often closely aligned with Catholic scholars, but without making reference to specifically religious ideas or claims. The book is accessible to readers without significant prior philosophical knowledge, although it will be better appreciated by those with more knowledge of philosophical debates, who would be well-advised to pay close attention to her footnotes.