Drew M. Dalton’s book focuses on our persistent philosophical obsession with the notion of an “absolute good” within the history of Western philosophy. Despite philosophical attempts since Kant to reject the notion of an absolute, Dalton argues, it remains present in contemporary ethics. The adherence to an absolute good not only has theoretical and practical shortcomings, but also produces that which it professes to eliminate, evil. According to Dalton many, if not all, of the atrocities of the past several hundred years were “set up in the name of some form of absolute justice, purity, power, or security” (2). For Dalton, the history of ethics runs parallel to political history. Politics and ethics are not causally connected (one determining the another) but are linked by a shared pathology—the failure to think outside an absolute. The imperative to reject an absolute is not new, since it reflects the efforts of continental philosophy, the Frankfurt School and Critical Theory, phenomenology, and other philosophical movements to escape the perceived limitations of the philosophical tradition and to respond to the fascism of the mid-twentieth century. What is distinctive in Dalton’s analysis is that it does not propose a wholesale rejection of the absolute but acknowledges its “necessary function” in ethical deliberation and action.
According to Dalton’s analysis, we need a foundational assertion of the good from which we can carry out ethical deliberation and establish what we do and do not want politically. This is due to the power a notion of the absolute has over our lives, whether it be God or the Other. However, Dalton argues, our ethical judgments should hold a relation with the absolute good not through affirmation but through negation and resistance. It is only through a “ ‘backward-turning relation’ to the absolute Other which grounds and conditions one’s existence, beliefs, and very way of being” that “practical justice” might be grounded (114). I take Dalton to mean that we must acknowledge the power that notions of the absolute have over human life, but only by criticizing appeals to the absolute, thereby clearing space for a “new mode of ethical thinking.”
To cultivate this new thinking, argues Dalton, we must theoretically separate what exists actually and concretely (time, context, society, etc.) from any universal, abstract, fixed notion of the good. Yet, even if the theoretical-ethical position were reversed in order to focus on constructing a good in relation to actual and concrete problems (local political issues or present crises such as climate change) and without adherence to an abstract absolute, Dalton still warns against the danger of blind abstractions of the present in relation to a future good. As he asks, “how are we to derive ethical action in the present from the possibility of a good that can only manifest in the hope for the future? How are we to respond today to the evils justified by whatever fanaticism is au courant?” (24) The author approaches this task in an almost dialectical fashion in chapters two through five by engaging with both contemporary figures (Alain Badiou and Quentin Meillassoux) and early phenomenologists (Husserl, Heidegger, and Levinas) to show the philosophical ineffectiveness of each ethical framework and build upon the ways in which these thinkers contribute to resisting the dogmatisms of Western ethics. In the prescriptive part of his analysis that follows, Dalton relies on readings of John Milton, Schelling, Lacan, Foucault’s later works on the “care of the self,” and other post-structuralists to establish an ethics that pursues the good only negatively in order to resist the evil that any pursuit of an absolute good can produce.
A major lesson of Dalton’s reading of twentieth-century ethics is that we must both recognize our inability to part with the fundamental ideas and commitments of the philosophical canon while seeking to resist these ideas by creating a different path. The primary target of the ethics of resistance in this sense is the concept of the absolute that is present in the face-to-face relation to the Other in Levinas’ Totality and Infinity. The notion of the absolute that is in question is the absolute Other that, according to Dalton, demands the obedience of another person; this absolute Other is (or can become) a “tyrant who threatens to destroy the very existence and freedom which it founds and justifies” (50). This interpretation of Levinas is problematic, since it seems not to recognize the subtle but decisive distinctions between the Other, others, and the face-to-face encounter that mark Levinas’ notion of ethics in his early work. The author needs to attend to central concepts in Levinas’ ethics, such as “substitution,” in greater depth. Instead, this analysis reads as if Dalton is using Levinas as a springboard for his own interventions without critical engagement with the author himself. Moreover, for Dalton the ethical value of Levinas’ ethics, as he argues in chapter three, invoking Schelling, is that the Other is the “ground and condition of our subjective life” (111), but its goodness is a pretext because it is “capable of reversing at any time from good to evil . . . evil is the ultimate result of any attempt to relate oneself to any absolute good perfectly” (50). This is the most intriguing assertion on the moral psychology of evil in Dalton’s analysis. Dalton proposes that evil is not a matter of moral deficiency or privation but originates in the pursuit of a moral purism and absolutism. In this respect, true evil is the outcome of our own conscious effort to hold steadfastly to our moral values, becoming what Dalton calls “yea-saying attendants of the idea of the absolute” (2). The summum bonum or system of ethics that is predicated on a notion of the absolute succumbs to the very outcome it condemns.
The pedagogical and philosophical significance of Dalton’s analysis of the history of ethics is not found in its broad strokes but in his interventions on twentieth and twenty-first-century figures, such as Levinas (despite the criticism noted above), Heidegger, Badiou, etc. These interpretations would be of interest to scholars and students studying twentieth-century phenomenology, continental philosophy, and post-Kantian ethics. Dalton effectively presents an overview of the basic problems and concepts of ethics within the phenomenological tradition. Dalton’s concluding proposal to see “politics as first philosophy” would be appealing to those who seek to engage with the political consequences of philosophical thought (114). Accordingly, philosophers should not retreat from politics or attempt to purify philosophy of political issues; rather, as Dalton argues, the “ethical, social, and political realities of how one lives one’s own life are essential to inquiring properly into the nature of what reality ultimately is” (114). Yet the author seems to exclude from his analysis episodes in political history when thinkers such as Frederick Douglass have used conceptions of the absolute good in order to make claims against the enslavement of human beings and to make claims in favor of gender and racial equality. Moreover, one shortcoming of the analysis lies in Dalton’s framing of the project in relation to the Western canon as a whole. This would entail conflating Christian (or even Abrahamic) notions of the absolute with Aristotelian, Epicurean, or Stoic conceptions. There appears to be more of an assumption than an investigation of the continuity of ideas and values across historical periods and philosophical movements. And an even more pressing problem is that Dalton’s assertions about the history of philosophy—which often read as polemical within his analysis—are largely Kantian and do not refer to current scholarship’s revisions and reinterpretations of the philosophical tradition, which include previously excluded thinkers—particularly women and people of color—who are increasingly being integrated into conversations about ethics and who provide other resources for thinking through fundamental concepts and problems.