The Ethics of the Family in Seneca

Placeholder book cover

Liz Gloyn, The Ethics of the Family in Seneca, Cambridge, 2017, 249 pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107145474.

Reviewed by Gretchen Reydams-Schils, University of Notre Dame


In this groundbreaking study of the ethics of the family in Seneca's philosophical writings, the author's methodological presuppositions open the way for significant fresh insights. First, studying the ethics of the family as a philosophical topic does not amount to endorsing an agenda of 'family values.' We can take the theme of the normativity of family life as seriously as Seneca did (and other Stoics of the Roman imperial era). Second, we thereby also avoid the commonplace but mistaken assumption that in their treatments of such a theme the later Stoics merely made concessions to Roman social practices, in a process of accommodation. The philosophical starting point of Gloyn's study is the place of the family in the Stoic theory of oikeiƓsis, often translated as 'appropriation.' The notion posits that human beings are born with an awareness of their constitution and needs, and an affective disposition towards themselves that makes them aim at self-preservation. This disposition, which human beings share with animals and which from early on combines a self-oriented and a social aspect, continues to evolve over the course of a human life-time and is fundamentally reoriented by the advent of reason. Crucial to Gloyn's analysis is a well-known image from the Stoic Hierocles (2nd c. AD, preserved in Stobaeus 4.671.7-673.11) that presumably maps the notion of appropriation (though not mentioned in that passage) onto a set of concentric circles. At the center is one's mind surrounded by the circle that contains one's body, followed by another circle that contains one's more intimate social relations with parents, siblings, wife, and children, one that contains one's more remote relatives, and so on, in ever broadening circles of relationships, all the way up to the circle of universal humanity. Hierocles recommends that we keep moving the more remote circles inwards, so that in the end we would be equally close to all human beings (though different modes of relationships would continue to exist). According to this model the relationship between parents and children plays a central role in the formation of our sociability, and this point is underscored by other sources.

Third, developing a hermeneutical principle, Gloyn (p. 8) builds on Brad Inwood's notion, in his 2005 book on Seneca, of a 'two-level mode of discourse' according to which, as Gloyn puts it, Seneca's 'writing operates on both a philosophical and an "everyday" level.' Gloyn posits that the philosophical level also shapes and infiltrates Seneca's use of everyday or more traditional forms of discourse. This approach allows her to keep together all of Seneca's philosophical writings, and to overcome problematic distinctions between what is and is not philosophical in these writings. Moreover, Gloyn successfully combines aspects of so-called cultural studies with philosophical content, and that feature is one of the greatest merits of this study.

The first chapter focuses on the role of mothers in the consolation addressed to Marcia, who lost a son, and the one addressed to his own mother Helvia, who is grieving over Seneca's exile. Chapter 2 focuses on the sibling relationship in the consolation addressed to the freedman Polybius, who lost a brother. Chapter 3 covers Seneca's treatment of marriage and also offers a very valuable reassessment of the fragments of the now lost On Marriage (see also the Appendix, with a translation of the fragments). Chapter 4 focuses on the third book of On Benefits to assess how Seneca rewrites the father-son relationship. Chapter 5 demonstrates how Seneca uses the imperial family to subtly undermine its status and claims to moral perfection. Finally, Chapter 6 maps out the progress throughout Seneca's Letters of his use of the family as a locus of normativity: after initially bracketing that theme because his addressee needs to detach himself from his old value system, Seneca, Gloyn argues, gradually reintroduces the family, but cautiously, because its normativity remains ambivalent.

For that latter point in the Letters, and throughout Seneca's philosophical writings, Gloyn could have made more use of the notion of moral corruption as found in Stoicism. The general Stoic view stipulates that people are drawn to the wrong value system (i.e. the non-Stoic one) for two reasons: first, because of a certain attraction inherent in things themselves, and second, because of the wrong influence of others, and especially one's close relatives. Hence, while the family is a primary locus of normativity, family relationships as traditionally construed still have to be rewritten so that they can become the bearers of the Stoic values, which stipulate that virtue is the only good and vice the only evil. This goal, as Gloyn shows convincingly, is the leitmotiv for Seneca's treatment of these relationships.

In the first chapters Gloyn demonstrates that Seneca reorients the role of mothers and siblings towards a cosmic dimension. The best test for any hermeneutical principle is the fresh readings it can provide. Gloyn, for instance, can explain why Seneca devotes so much attention to Marcia's father, Cordus, in a consolation that is meant to address the death of her son. A daughter losing a father is not socially disruptive, i.e. in the sense that the death of a parent precedes that of a child, whereas the death of a son is a social disaster (p. 32). But if Seneca had a model of appropriation in mind that resembles the image of the concentric circles in Hierocles' fragments, Gloyn argues, the father-daughter and the daughter-son relationship would both be on the same level in this alternative social hierarchy, and thus Seneca can use the parallels between Cordus and Marcia's son to console her also for her second loss.

Just as mothers can imitate Nature (or providence) in its care for the universe, the universe can also provide us with a new perspective on siblings. This extended family is not merely metaphorical, though, as Gloyn appears to suggest (p. 67): because all human beings literally have their origin in the active divine principle, the kinship between them is real and anchored in nature. As children of Zeus, they are all truly siblings of one another.

In the chapter on marriage Gloyn counters the view of Seneca as a misogynist (see also the Introduction, p. 11). While I would agree that Seneca endorses some version of the claim that men and women have an equal potential for virtue, I would still like to hold on to the nuance that Seneca endorses a form of 'essentialism' in contemporary parlance (the view that women's essence, while equally good, is fundamentally different from men's, and manifests itself differently). And this perspective still sets him apart from other Stoics such as Musonius Rufus. Even in the more limited collection of fragments, Gloyn presents the section quoted by Jerome in V 50 as genuine (pp. 90ff.), and that fragment parses virtue for women primarily as pudicitia. Gloyn's claim that 'Seneca takes the conventional value applied to married women, but uses it as a way to discuss the kinds of behavior by which married women might manifest true virtue, that is, their grasp of the knowledge of good and evil' (pp. 93-94) is an extrapolation from the fragment in question. Moreover, the parallel with Musonius Rufus' discussion of the virtues of women (3 ed. Lutz, invoked by Gloyn on p. 91) is limited: Musonius Rufus couches his view in very strong non-essentialist terms and explicitly lists all four cardinal virtues, starting with the virtue of reason.

There is a curious tension between Gloyn's treatment of Seneca's marital relationship with Paulina as portrayed in Letter 104 and her return to the same topic in the final chapter, on the Letters in their entirety. In the chapter on marriage she focuses on the 'tenderness and intimacy' of the relationship (p. 101) and rejects John Henderson's interpretation that Seneca, apparently, had to escape from his wife (n. 66). In the final chapter, however, the author endorses Henderson's reading (p. 196) and states that 'the portrait of husbandly affection at the start of this letter is almost completely undermined by its content.' Yet I would argue that the theory of 'appropriation,' which is the crucial theoretical underpinning of Gloyn's study, would have allowed Seneca to broaden his perspective throughout the letter without leaving his spouse behind, except in the sense of physical distance. If he 'needs to look after himself for her sake' (104.2, p. 101), she continues to be present to him while he is doing exactly that, in the full Stoic sense of taking care of oneself.

Gloyn shows in the chapter devoted to the father-son relationship how Seneca in the third book of his On Benefits rewrites that relationship -- which traditionally is rife with tension and competition for status, wealth, and power -- into a contest of virtue. One could add that, with this alternative depiction of the father-son dynamic, Seneca maybe also wanted to forestall a father's potential anxiety over a son's interest in an alternative value-system as prescribed by philosophy. As Seneca tells us himself, his own father had such misgivings (Ep. 108.22), and Musonius Rufus devoted a discourse specifically to the problem of a son disobeying his father by pursuing philosophy (16 ed. Lutz).

This well-written, engaging, and highly innovative study, which includes a wide-ranging and inclusive bibliography of secondary literature, should change the perspective of scholars working on philosophy, on literature, and on social history. I, for one, am eagerly looking forward to the promised second installment, on Seneca's tragedies.