The Ethics of Voting

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Jason Brennan, The Ethics of Voting, Princeton University Press, 2011, 222pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691144818.

Reviewed by Chad Flanders, Saint Louis University School of Law


Many people believe that voting is not just a good thing to do; they think that we have a positive duty to vote, and that non-voting would violate that duty. Moreover, many think that we have this duty no matter how we vote (so long as we don't, for instance, vote for the Neo-Nazi candidate). Voting is one of the most important rites of citizenship we have, and we are bad citizens, perhaps even bad people, if we fail to vote.

Jason Brennan disagrees with all of this. He thinks that we have a romanticized picture of voting and voters, one which puts the expressive value of voting above the quality of a person's vote. Voting, on Brennan's view, is just another activity -- like riding a bike or skiing or playing an instrument. We can do it well or we can do it poorly. And if we do it poorly, it's probably better that we don't do it at all. When ignorant voters vote, Brennan says, "though they intend to promote the common good, they all too often lack sufficient evidence to justify the policies they advocate." When bad voters vote anyway, Brennan argues, "they pollute democracy with their votes and make it more likely that we will have to suffer from bad governance" (5). It wouldn't just be a good thing if more bad voters didn't vote; for Brennan, bad voters have a duty not to vote.

As the above quote testifies, Brennan's book is resolutely hard-headed. He does not suffer fools, and has no truck with "democratic fundamentalists" (a term he borrows from Bryan Caplan) who valorize democracy beyond its usefulness as a decision-making method. (8) But Brennan is never mean-spirited, and the book is a great joy to read. It is, to my knowledge, the only book length treatment of the ethics of voting -- whether we should vote, and how. Those who work in political philosophy will benefit greatly from engaging with this book and its arguments.

The book has seven chapters, plus an introduction. The introduction sets the stage by rehearsing the conventional wisdom that we all have a duty to vote, and that it is better to vote than to abstain from voting. Brennan adds a corollary to this, which he will challenge in a later chapter: that one should never sell one's vote. Brennan thinks that the conventional wisdom about voting is deeply flawed. If one votes, one has an obligation to vote well, and this means that your reasons for voting must be "morally and epistemically justified" and based on the common good (4). The rest of the book is his argument to this effect.

Chapter one dispatches two arguments that start from the value of individual voting. Voting is good, these arguments say, because it promotes either your own good or the public good, or because it "saves democracy." Brennan is right that these arguments are rather weak. His argument against both is roughly the same: the effect your vote will have on anyone's interests (your own or others) or on democracy as a whole is vanishingly small. It can't be that we have a duty to vote based on our ability to produce good electoral outcomes because what we contribute to those good outcomes by voting just isn't enough to get us to a duty.

But the failure of these kinds of arguments leads to arguments that Brennan thinks have a little more merit: the agency argument, the public goods argument, and the civic virtue argument. These have less to do with the impact one's vote might have and more about the duty one has to cast a vote. The purest version of this idea is the civic virtue argument, which says voting just is part of being a good citizen. This argument accords, I think, with the brute intuition that surrounds many prevailing notions of the duty to vote. But what if there are other ways of being a good citizen? Does this affect whether we have a duty to vote?

"Civic Virtue without Politics," certainly one of the most interesting chapters in the book, asserts that our duty to be a good citizen can be discharged in other ways besides voting. Indeed, "Being an exceptional citizen need not involve any political participation" at all (47). If this is so, and it seems hard to dispute, then this puts some pressure on the idea that voting is a mandatory civic duty. Why must I discharge my civic duty only by voting, and not in any of countless other ways? And what if I do my duty better by discharging my civic duty in a way other than voting? Even those who engage in no public spirited activities (such as writing letters to the editor) at all may still indirectly contribute to the common good by enabling others to be publicly spirited. In this chapter are the seeds of what we might call an "extrapolitical civic republicanism." At the same time, this type of emphasis on ways to be civically minded outside of voting may miss a unique feature of voting: it is something we all can do together, no matter how much money or skill we have. This is not true of, say, writing letters to the editor.

But Brennan wants to make a stronger argument than simply that there are other ways than voting to be civic. He wants to argue that some have a positive duty not to vote, that they should abstain from casting a ballot. This is true, Brennan says, even if the odds of our (bad) vote affecting electoral outcomes are rather small. One has an obligation to refrain from harming people when there is no significant cost in doing so even if the risks of this harm are low. Such is the case with voting. Voting may make some people feel good about themselves but the results of bad voting can be bad policy. "By voting," Brennan concludes, "bad voters consume psychological goods at our collective expense." (75)

Good voters, by contrast, will both be informed and vote for policies that promote the common good. (113) Brennan does not hold that in order to be a good voter, one must have the right conception of the common good; after all, there are many of them, and some of them may be false or actually harmful to the common good. All that Brennan requires is that a voter be justified in thinking that the policy or candidate she votes for would promote the common good (118). Thus, voters need not be correct in their beliefs, only epistemically justified. But, as Brennan elaborates later in the book, many voters are not epistemically justified in their votes, and so are "bad voters." They have an obligation to abstain from voting. The sobering implication is that many of us -- including the ones reading the book -- are bad voters (161).

What should we make of Brennan's arguments about the ethics of voting? Again, Brennan is concerned with removing much of the sentimentalism that surrounds voting. Doubtless many of us feel that we are doing something good when we vote, when we rise early (or go late) to the polls, and cast our vote. Many of us certainly wish we were better educated about the issues and the candidates, but we try our best, and we do what we think is our duty to get out and vote. Brennan wants us to look more coldly at why we vote, whether we are justified in voting, and whether our voting does any good.

But is there really no argument for the sentimental position? I wonder if Brennan's view about the utility of political institutions may prevent him from seeing the value of simply voting together with others. Brennan shies away from symbolic value in general, and the expressive value of voting in particular, arguing that institutions are "more like hammers -- they are judged by how well they work. Good institutions get us good results; bad institutions get us bad results" (92). So too must we look at the value of voting in terms of whether it gets us good or bad results.

But some things worth doing are worth doing even if they may lead to bad results. Not all things can be captured in hammers and nails. There is a value in the civic solidarity that voting at its best engenders, which may outlast this or that election, and which goes beyond personal preference or good feelings.

Civic solidarity might also be linked to another important value: legitimacy. The idea of voting is that we all have a say in how we ought to be governed. The more who participate (even the more "bad" voters who participate) the more legitimate a government is. The value here isn't about results, but about the goodness of the process of electing people. At one point, Brennan seems to suggest that if there were someone wise enough, we should just make her queen and dispense with democracy (102). While not exactly a reductio, this does suggest that Brennan may be missing something important about what makes democracy valuable, viz., popular participation and the legitimacy that comes from it.

And however persuasive Brennan's argument about the many various non-voting ways we can contribute to the civic good, it pays to note how distinctive the act of voting is. It is one way we can participate in the political process that is in principle open to every adult man or woman, regardless of race or class. Voting is a near universal act. Other activities that might be instances of civic virtue are not nearly as universal. So voting is an important maker of civic solidarity: it is one of the rare things that members of a nation do together. This, incidentally, might be why selling one's vote is bad, even if someone could cast a better informed vote (which Brennan says is perfectly fine): you're giving away your right to participate in the collective act of voting.

Brennan admits that his argument that bad voters should not vote and (epistemically justified) good voters should vote is elitist (95). One of the benefits of the sentimentalist view -- that we all have a duty to vote -- is that it is resolutely anti-elitist. Everyone has the duty to vote, to make their voice heard, as we collectively choose our leaders. All are welcome.

To be sure, this sort of civic solidarity is probably more expressive than anything; it is not a good result that we end up producing, like economic growth or racial equality. To this extent, it is a non-instrumental good, and so I can imagine Brennan being skeptical of its worth (see, for instance, his remarks about civic solidarity at 87). What is the value of civic solidarity -- even supposing voting can achieve it -- against the harm that may come from bad voters voting? But perhaps it is enough to show that civic solidarity has a value that has some weight in the ledger, and is not merely reducible to the psychological satisfaction each one of us may get by voting. Good results are not all that matter in a democracy.

Nor, for that matter, is it very clear what would count as "good results." Suppose a person is pro-life, and thinks that under the current regime, thousands of innocent lives are being lost. As a result, she votes for the pro-life candidate for president, even though that candidate has views on foreign policy and the economy which will lead to bad results. Is she justified in voting for the pro-life candidate?

More generally, we can imagine that in any given election there will be many more possibly legitimate views of what the common good will count as in the election. The epistemic burden may accordingly be lighter, depending on the election and depending on the issues. We do not have to know everything about each candidate. We just have to know enough about the issue or issues we deem to be most important, and to know which candidate comes closer to the common good on the relevant issue(s). For example, in the 2004 election many people (understandably) saw foreign policy as the most important issue, and thought Bush was the better candidate than Kerry. Were those voters "bad voters"? It is hard to say that they obviously were. (See, in this regard, Brennan's acknowledgment that there will be reasonable disagreement about who counts as a "qualified" voter [109]).

Brennan notes that there are multiple theories of what counts as the common good. He lists seven possibilities, all described at a very high level of abstraction (117-118). It is doubtful that many voters, except for philosophers, have conceptions of the common good like these. Nor do any of the conceptions seem to allow that what people want may be an important brute constituent of the "common good." This links up the point about the importance of individual participation and civic solidarity to a concern about results. Part of what is important about voting is that, to some extent, we decide together what counts as the common good.

Brennan's book is short, and crisply argued. As a result, there are some key notions such as justified voting and the common good that are not as fully fleshed out as one would wish. Sometimes Brennan seems to revel too much in being contrarian, which nonetheless is what makes reading the book so much fun.

It is true that if we accept Brennan's view of what voting and democracy are for, many of his conclusions about the value of the vote and the harm of bad voting follow. But what if we disagree with his premises? A defense of these would require a longer book; indeed, it would require an entire political philosophy. But we should not complain too much: this is an engaging, well-written book on a too long neglected topic.