The Ethics of War: Essays

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Saba Bazargan-Forward and Samuel C. Rickless (eds.), The Ethics of War: Essays, Oxford University Press, 2017, 304pp., $78.00, ISBN 9780199376148.


Reviewed by Uwe Steinhoff, University of Hong Kong


On the back cover the book is advertised as "The authoritative anthology on the ethics and law of war." This might be an overstatement. While the best-edited volumes on just war theory focus on a particular issue (for instance, preventive war, humanitarian intervention, or legitimate authority), this volume does not really form a coherent whole.


In fact, Nancy Sherman's "Moral Recovery After War" has very little to do with either the laws or the ethics of war, dealing instead, as she herself acknowledges, with "philosophical moral psychology" (244). Moreover, the contributions by Adil Ahmad Haque on the principle of discrimination, of Kai Draper on the doctrine of double effect, and of Larry May on the rights of soldiers have appeared in very similar if not almost identical versions in other publications by these authors (as chapters of their books in the first two cases, and as a contribution to another edited volume in the latter case.) There is nothing intrinsically wrong with these three chapters (on the contrary, all are intelligent contributions). But in my view, such extensive recycling would only be justified if the three chapters had either established themselves as classics, which is certainly not the case given that these publications are very recent, or would clearly contribute to an "authoritative" or at least representative picture of the ethics of war. However, I see no indication for this. In any case, given that these chapters have appeared in similar form elsewhere, I will not discuss them further here. Furthermore, I only mention in passing Andrew Altman's very good chapter on the law and morality of targeted killing via drones (which together with Draper's and Haque's contributions is grouped in the laws of war section of the book.) Instead, I focus on the remaining philosophical contributions.


These contributions, according to the editors, belong to a new, allegedly "revisionist" school of just war theory: "Since the writing of the scholastics and jurists of the late Renaissance and Early Modern periods . . . two precepts have underwritten accounts of the morality of war," namely, that war is a "relation not between individuals but between states" and that "the rules governing conduct in war should proceed independently of whether the war fought is just or unjust" (xi). Bazargan-Forward and Rickless provide no textual evidence in support of these claims. This is not surprising as these claims -- although they have for some time now been the basis of self-proclaimed "revisionism -- are simply wrong.[1] Accordingly, the term "revisionism" in this context is a misnomer and should be rejected as misleading.[2] More importantly for present purposes, if the editorial foreword already makes sweeping but mistaken assertions about the just war tradition, then this undermines the volume's claim to be an "authoritative" contribution to this tradition.


Be that as it may, let us have a closer look at some of the individual contributions. Jeff McMahan believes in "liability justifications" for the infliction of harm. That is, he thinks that a person's being liable to the infliction of a certain harm (which means that she has forfeited the right that the harm not be inflicted) provides a defeasible justification for inflicting this harm on her.[3] Given that he also believes that mere moral responsibility -- which need not amount to culpability -- for a threat of unjust harm is the basis of liability to defensive harm, he faces the problem that a defender would, on his account, be justified in killing an infinite number of responsible but morally entirely innocent threats (like drivers who foresaw that driving would impose a tiny risk of harm on pedestrians, and then, through no fault of their own, lose control over their cars and pose a substantial threat to a pedestrian). McMahan's solution to this problem is to suggest a third kind of proportionality. In the past, he has already distinguished between "wide proportionality" and "narrow proportionality," where the former refers to harms inflicted on threats or aggressors, and the latter to harms inflicted on bystanders. Yet these conceptual innovations are unnecessary. The actual distinction, at least in law, is not between different kinds of proportionality, but between different justifications: the self-defense justification on the one hand, and the necessity or choice of evil justification on the other hand. In any case, McMahan now suggests solving the problem by an appeal to "proportionality in the aggregate" (25, emphasis in the original). However, this solution seems to be entirely ad hoc and to rely solely on McMahan's intuitions, without any theoretical foundation or further explanation.


This is precisely David Rodin's charge against McMahan's approach (45). Rodin's own solution to the problem involves what he calls a "lesser evil obligation" (28). Bear in mind that, as already mentioned, a liability justification is supposed to be defeasible. It is, for example, defeasible if acting on the liability justification would have consequences that are bad enough to override the justification. Regarding such consequences, Rodin states that "harm inflicted on a liable person is still an evil from an impersonal view" (36). Accordingly, if the number of liable persons is large enough, the overall evil that would be produced by acting on the liberty to kill all these persons can override this liberty -- thus producing an all-things-considered lesser evil obligation not to do what one has a Hohfeldian liberty to do. Unfortunately, the quite correct idea that harming a person constitutes an evil is incompatible with the very idea of a liability justification: if persons have intrinsic value, then the mere fact that they have forfeited a right not to be harmed does not yet provide a justification to harm them.[4] Your lacking a Hohfeldian right that I not kill you provides me with a Hohfeldian liberty to kill you, but it does not yet provide me with a justification to kill you (and to thereby destroy something of value).[5]


As an aside, while Rodin, to his credit, does not claim that the concept of a lesser evil obligation is a novelty, the editors make this claim in his stead (xiii). Yet, the idea that a "right bearer is all things considered obligated to behave in a certain way toward a person despite the fact that they have the right with respect to that party to behave otherwise" (33) is most definitely not novel at all; it has been known in the German legal literature for at least 200 years.[6] Anglo-Saxon legal scholars are acquainted with this idea too.


Richard Arneson sets out to resolve what Seth Lazar has called "the responsibility dilemma." Yet he apparently misunderstands what solving the dilemma means. Lazar rejects outright McMahan's responsibility account of liability (that is Lazar's external criticism) but makes it very clear that his "critique of McMahan's argument" in terms of the responsibility dilemma "is internal" to that account.[7] The challenge is basically that McMahan's account makes either too many civilians or too few combatants liable to attack. Accordingly, a solution would require a demonstration that McMahan's responsibility account is able to escape the dilemma.[8] Offering a completely different account of liability, in contrast, does not so much solve the dilemma as change the subject. This, however, is precisely what Arneson does. In fact, he offers two different accounts of liability (which are supposed to interact with each other.). First, he "proposes abandoning" the idea that a right can be overridden although it is still present; that is, he seems to reject the idea that non-liable persons can be permissibly harmed. Instead, he states: "For any moral right not to be treated in certain ways, the right gives way if the ratio of the badness to nonrightholders if the right is not acted against to the badness to rightholders if the right is acted against is sufficiently favorable" (70). In other words, the availability of a lesser evil justification would not give one a justification to override existing rights. Instead, it would show that the harm inflicted on the basis of the lesser-evil justification does not infringe any rights in the first place -- the rights have "given way." This would mean that a war waged in accordance with a lesser-evil justification violates no one's rights, not even the rights of all the innocent people, including children, who have been killed, burned, and mutilated. While this might indeed be a way to avoid contingent pacifism, as Arneson is determined to do, it also leads to not taking rights seriously. Arneson's second account of liability is "fault forfeits first" (85). Since I demonstrate elsewhere that this account has entirely counter-intuitive implications and justifies all kinds of acts that Western jurisdictions quite reasonably qualify as murder,[9] I will not go into it further here.[10]


Victor Tadros's aim is "to show that there are circumstances in which duress can justify killing a person where that killing would otherwise be wrong" (115). He claims: "Duress justifies [an act v] where X's [the threatener's] threat is sufficiently credible and grave to render it permissible for D to v." (96) However, it should be quite obvious that it is not duress that is providing a justification here, but the threat's being sufficiently credible and grave to render the act permissible. That is, the actual justification is a lesser-evil justification. So all that Tadros shows is that acts committed under duress can sometimes be justified with a lesser-evil justification. However, first, that is nothing new, and second, the same can be said about acts committed against payment. In short, there is no such thing as a separate and independent "duress justification," just as there is no separate and independent "monetary-reward justification."


Mattias Iser tries to refute Richard Norman's and David Rodin's claim that it is always disproportionate to kill in defense of civil and political rights. (208) He does this in the context of revolutionary violence. However, it would appear that a refutation of the claim would be applicable to both national self-defense (which is the context in which the claim is usually discussed) and revolution. In other words, it is unclear what difference the reference to revolution is supposed to make. In any case, Iser puts heavy emphasis on "respect" and its "expression," and he claims that although individual attacks may "express utter disrespect, they can never humiliate as deeply as an unjust, for example racist, basic structure" (216). Thus, it seems that Iser's strategy is to accept -- at least for the sake of argument -- Norman's and Rodin's claims about individual self-defense,[11] but then to argue that much more is at stake in the case of revolution against an unjust regime. However, it seems to me that Iser is confusing things here. If according to the state's basic structure I have no right to vote, then the state will constantly keep me from voting. It is not so much that the state thereby "expresses" more "disrespect" than an individual who keeps me from voting on a single occasion; rather, the difference lies in constantly being kept from voting on the one hand and occasionally being kept from voting on the other. Moreover, if the state denies everyone the right to vote, it denies them democracy. In contrast, an individual who falsely imprisons me on election day does not deny me democracy.[12] Thus, the material harms are very different, and it is quite reasonable to suppose that this difference, not the expression of disrespect, is doing most of the work. To show that Iser might severely overestimate the evil that is the expression of disrespect, note that merely attempted murder expresses as much disrespect as successful murder, while accidental (non-negligent and non-reckless) killing expresses no disrespect at all. It is safe to assume that people would vastly prefer the former to the latter, and thus are far more concerned with material harm than with expressions of disrespect. After all, people can quite literally live with attempted murder. They cannot live with accidental death.


François Tanguay-Renaud examines the question whether there could be something like corporate state liability to attack. He thinks that the idea is intelligible but that such liability might be "of very limited relevance to the morality of war" (137). I am even more skeptical the Tanguay-Renaud, but his exploration of the question is thoughtful, cautious, and interesting.


Finally, Seth Lazar suggests new ways of structuring just war theory. He suggests that what he calls "Command Ethics" serves to "govern the morality of war as a whole," while "Combatant Ethics governs the morality of specific actions" (231). He rejects the suggestion that this distinction corresponds to the familiar distinction of jus ad bellum and jus in bello, between "analysis of the war as a whole and of individual actions and operations that compose it," as "confused" (231-232). His reasons for this assessment are, first, that "each individual combatant must also consider whether his resort to war is justified," and second, that "we should not confine Command Ethics to focusing only on the resort to war" (323). However, both reasons are unconvincing. The first is unconvincing because an individual combatant's jus in bello consideration of whether his acts of participation in the war are justified is clearly different from an individual combatant's jus ad bellum consideration of whether the collective war effort as a whole is justified. The second is unconvincing because the view that jus ad bellum concerns only the resort to war but not the question as to whether war should be continued is mistaken.[13] Lazar also proposes distinguishing "between the positive justifying reasons that count in favor of fighting, and the constraints that must either be satisfied or overridden for fighting to be permissible" (242). There is nothing wrong with this distinction, but it is unclear why it should affect the structure of just war theory. In any case, once one gives up the obsessive focus on liability common among self-proclaimed "revisionists" and avoids the misleading talk of "liability justifications," one might come to realize that any actual moral or legal justification necessarily comprises both elements.


This volume is not all bad, and some of the contributions are good, but on the whole it leaves much to be desired. It certainly is not "authoritative."

[1] As regards the (mistaken) claim that traditional just war theory saw war as a relation between states, see Gregory M. Reichberg, "Historiography of Just War Theory," in Seth Lazar and Helen Frowe (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Ethics of War (Oxford University Press, 2015), Oxford Handbooks Online: DOI: 10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199943418.013.18, section 1; Daniel Schwartz, "Late Scholastic Just War Theory," in Lazar and Frowe, op. cit., DOI: 10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199943418.013.13, section 2.3; Uwe Steinhoff, "Doing Away with ‘Legitimate Authority,’" Journal of Military Ethics, forthcoming. As regards the alleged independence of jus ad bellum and jus in bello in the tradition and the related claim that it endorses a "moral equality of combatants" – it should by now be clear that these charges against the tradition are flatly wrong (the claim to be "revisionist" seems to stem from a complete misunderstanding of the tradition). For proof, see, for instance, Cheyney Ryan, "Democratic Duty and the Moral Dilemmas of Soldiers," Ethics 122 (2011), pp. 10-42, at 13-18; Uwe Steinhoff, "Rights, Liability, and the Moral Equality of Combatants," Journal of Ethics 13 (2012), pp. 339-366, section 2; Gregory M. Reichberg, "The Moral Equality of Combatants – A Doctrine in Classical Just War Theory? A Response to Graham Parsons," Journal of Military Ethics 12(2) (2013), pp. 181-194. All the texts just referenced do provide ample textual evidence for their claims.

[2] Seth Lazar suggests that the "revisionists" at least revise Walzer, and that one becomes revisionist by revising something. See By the same logic, Walzer would also be a revisionist (he revised a lot), and virtually all present-day just war theorists deviate from Walzer in one way or the other (so who would be a non-revisionist?). Also, again by the same logic, all just war theorists would also be conservative at the same time – because they conserve something.

[3] In my view, liability is one thing and justification another. Liability provides no justification at all, neither defeasible nor otherwise. See Uwe Steinhoff, "Self-Defense as Claim Right, Liberty, and Act-Specific Agent-Relative Prerogative," Law and Philosophy 35(2) (2016), pp. 193-209.

[4] See ibid.

[5] To be sure, this problem could be "solved" by redefining liability in such a way that one can only be liable to harm that is inflicted on one for a certain reason. McMahan indeed often talks in this way: "people can be liable to harm only in relation to a goal …" See Killing in War (Oxford University Press, 2009), p. 9. However, first, stipulative definitions do not solve substantive moral questions. Second, it is unclear how such a reason-dependent account of liability squares with McMahan's (and Rodin's, for that matter) simultaneously "objectivist," "fact-relative" account of liability. McMahan says that "justification provides exemption from liability only when it is objective," and something is "objectively … justifiable when what explains its … justifiability are facts that are independent of the agent's beliefs" (ibid., p. 43). Since when, however, are an agent’s goals "facts that are independent of the agent’s beliefs"? McMahan’s account of liability seems to be incoherent: there is no objective and reason-dependent “liability justification” for harming someone – you simply cannot have it both ways.

[6] The now common term Rechtsmißbrauch (rights abuse) was introduced into the German legal literature more than 80 years ago, but the concept is at least 200 years old; in fact, some even trace it back to Roman Law. See Elke Widmann, "Der Rechtsmissbrauch im Markenrecht," dissertation, available at;jsessionid=E5CC60B87151CA8B1C77FD3777EC6D24. Incidentally, I mentioned this idea in a footnote in "Rights, Liability, and the Moral Equality of Combatants", p. 457, n. 15. Elsewhere I talk of a "necessity prohibition," see Uwe Steinhoff, "Shortcomings of and Alternatives to the Rights-Forfeiture Theory of Justified Self-Defense and Punishment," available at I took myself to be stating the obvious there, not to be "add[ing] an important resource to the reductive individualist's conceptual arsenal," as Bazargan-Forward and Rickless would have it (xiii).

[7] Seth Lazar, "The Responsibility Dilemma for Killing in War: A Review Essay," Philosophy and Public Affairs 38(2) (2010), pp. 180-213, at 189.

[8] McMahan tried on several occasions to show this – unsuccessfully, in my view. Seth Lazar's most recent reply to such attempts looks to me like a coup de grâce. See Lazar's "Liability and the Ethics of War: A Response to Strawser and McMahan," in Christian Coons and Michael Weber, The Ethics of Self-Defense (Oxford University Press, 2016), pp. 292-304.

[9] See Uwe Steinhoff, "Replies," San Diego Law Review, forthcoming (see the part on Arneson).

[10] Incidentally, Arneson's account is very similar to Gerhard Øverland's in "Moral Taint: On the Transfer of the Implications of Moral Culpability," Journal of Applied Philosophy 28(2) (2011), pp. 122-136 (but Øverland is somewhat more cautious than Arneson). Arneson does not mention Øverland.

[11] There is actually no reason to do so. See Uwe Steinhoff, "Rodin on Self-Defense and the 'Myth' of National Self-Defense: A Refutation", Philosophia (2013), pp. 1017-1036; "Proportionality in Self-Defense," Journal of Ethics 21(3) (2017), pp. 263-289. Accordingly, there are more straightforward ways of refuting Norman's and Rodin's "bloodless invasion" (or a corresponding "bloodless tyranny") argument than Iser's appeal to the "expression of disrespect."

[12] Compare Helen Frowe, Defensive Killing (Oxford University Press, 2014), p. 143-145.

[13] See Uwe Steinhoff, "Just Cause and the Continuous Application of Jus ad Bellum," in Larry May, Shannon Elizabeth Fyfe, and Eric Joseph Ritter (eds.), The Cambridge Handbook on Just War Theory (Cambridge, forthcoming).