The Ethics of Wilfrid Sellars

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Jeremy Randel Koons, The Ethics of Wilfrid Sellars, Routledge, 2019, 360pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138708747.

Reviewed by Carl B. Sachs, Marymount University


Though it is no longer unusual to see Wilfrid Sellars regarded as a systematic and important philosopher, the Sellars renaissance of recent years has been largely focused on his theoretical philosophy. By contrast, Sellars's ethics has received much less attention, though with several important exceptions (Hurley 2000; Klemick 2018; Olen and Turner 2015, 2016). Jeremy Randel Koons's work is therefore of great interest not just because of his exacting reconstruction of Sellars's metaethics, but also because of his compelling demonstration of its contemporary relevance. The book is challenging, as Koons is committed to explicating Sellars's metaethics, showing how it resolves metaethical debates and stands in fruitful dialogue with other philosophical issues (such as the nature of shared intentionality), and correcting Sellars's account in crucial ways. In what follows I shall focus primarily on what I see as the major line of thought that runs through the book -- the essentially public nature of practical reasoning -- which Koons uses to structure the central tenets of Sellarsian metaethics.

To motivate Sellars's metaethics, Koons argues that it resolves a tension between cognitivism and non-cognitivism. On Koons's understanding, cognitivists hold that there is a logical relation between statements of fact and moral judgments, but not between moral judgments and action. Non-cognitivists hold that there is a strong connection between moral judgment and action but not one between statements of fact and moral judgments. Thus, not only does each side affirm what the other denies, but neither can do justice to the apparent fact that there is some connection (though not necessarily a logical connection) between statements of fact, moral judgments, and action. Koons situates Sellarsian metaethics as an Aufhebung to this classical debate in analytic metaethics.

The first step is to affirm the conceptual connection between moral judgments and action by arguing that "moral judgments express intentions and are thus conceptually connected to action" (2). This expressivism -- a thesis that Koons relates to what Robert Brandom calls 'the Kant-Sellars thesis' about modality -- tells us that what moral judgments say is what one is committed to doing in forming and acting upon a moral intention, just as (according to Brandom) modal statements are statements in a semantic metalanguage. Since intentions are essentially and necessarily connected with our explanations and justifications of actions, Sellars affirms the non-cognitivist emphasis on a conceptual connection between moral judgments and actions. However, Sellars also insists that "we can and do reason among intentions" (3) with regard to considerations of practical agency, public reason, and successful cooperation. Since we can and do reason among intentions essentially connected to action, we have a dialectically stable via media between cognitivism and non-cognitivism.

Since Sellarsian metaethics treats ethical discourse as expressions of shared intentions, Sellars is at odds with descriptivists about ethics, including both naturalists and non-naturalists. The problem for expressivism is largely one about how to reconcile expressivism with the idea that we can and do reason about moral judgments. Koons argues that Sellars's key innovation involves the following thought: if moral judgments are expressive of intentions, then it makes sense that we can and do reason about moral judgments and also that moral judgments are essentially connected with action and hence are intrinsically motivating. I shall call this Sellars's rational expressivism: ethical discourse is expressive, not descriptive (contra cognitivism) but what it expresses can be subjected to rational deliberation and assessment (contra some forms of noncognitivism).

Sellars captures the underlying logic of intentions by introducing 'shall' as an operator that operates on the contents of intentions. Thus, an intention such as "my children shall have a good education" is formally rendered as "Shall be (my children have a good education)" or "I shall write a book review" as "Shall do (write a book review)." (It is crucial to Sellars that shall-statements, like rules generally, can be about both what we ought to do and how the world ought to be.). On this basis Sellars then introduces the crucial distinction between individual intentions and joint intentions or what he calls "we-intentions". Before turning to we-intentions, I shall first need to say something about the distinctive character of practical reasoning as such.

Koons argues that we should see Sellars as belonging to a tradition that stresses the distinctive character of practical reasoning. As Koons observes, "I suspect that there is a temptation among philosophers to assimilate practical reasoning into the more formal elements of theoretical reason" (59). The crucial distinction is that the conclusion of a piece of theoretical reasoning is a belief about what is the case, but the conclusion of a piece of practical reasoning is not a belief at all, hence not even a belief about what one ought to do. Rather, the conclusion of a piece of practical reasoning is the intention to do something.

If one assimilates practical reasoning to theoretical reasoning, then one will take the conclusion of a piece of practical reasoning to be a belief about what one ought to do -- but that leaves unexplained the connection between that belief and the action itself. By contrast, by taking the conclusion of practical reasoning to be the expression of an intention, with the intimate connection between intentions and actions, we can see how moral judgments -- as expressions of a special kind of we-intentions -- are intimately linked to actions. However, intentions do not simply cause actions; we can reason amongst intentions and recognize good and bad inferences amongst them, e.g. "I shall write a book review about Koons's Ethics of Wilfrid Sellars, therefore I shall read it carefully." Thus we can identify good and bad practical inferences in terms of the intentions expressed by practical judgments.

However, individual practical reasoning about individual intentions is not the only kind of practical reasoning: there is also cooperative reasoning about shared intentions. The shall operator allows us to examine what Sellars calls 'We-intentions', wherein one intends something qua member of a group. The basic form of a we-intention is "Shallwe [I do A]": I affirm my commitment to performing an action because I am a member of a group that is jointly committed to performing actions of that kind. To be a member of a group is to have intentions that are constitutive of membership in that group (65). Koons shows that Sellars's account of we-intentions should be understood in light of recent work on shared intentionality by Gilbert (2014), Tuomela (2007), and Tomasello (2009). On these accounts, we need an account of group intentionality in which one intends to do A because of one's jointly held commitments, attitudes, and expectations with others with whom one is cooperating. Importantly, shared intentions need not take the form of occurrent mental states described in folk-psychological terms such as beliefs; they can involve implicit joint expectations or commitments that only become explicit when they break down. There are therefore two distinct kinds of intentions -- individual intentions and shared intentions -- that correspond to "two distinct kinds of reasoning -- individual reasoning and cooperative reasoning" (156).

A considerable strength of the book is the argumentative clarity that Koons brings to bear against two obstacles to a Sellarsian view of practical reasoning: formalism and instrumentalism. "Formalism" is Koons's term for a conception of reasoning -- both practical and theoretical -- "which holds that only deductively valid inferences are good inferences" (219). This conception of reasoning is at work in the assimilation of material inferences to formal inferences, which leads to the assumption that inferences must be monotonic and that material inferences are enthymematic. It is also, on Koon's view, what generates the temptation to adopt a Humean theory of motivation. Instrumentalism is the idea that all practical reasoning can be decomposed into individual acts of means-ends reasoning. Against formalism, Koons stresses the role of material inferences as distinct from formal inferences and that the kind of inferences used in expressions of intentional action are not fully captured by the rules of deductive logic. Against instrumentalism Koons stresses that moral evaluations are essentially collective insofar as they concern what anyone ought to do under relevantly similar circumstances. While formalism has been criticized by Brandom and Mark Lance, and instrumentalism by Christine Korsgaard and Jürgen Habermas, Koons shows how a robust understanding of practical agency requires bringing these two lines of thought together.

The conception of practical reasoning as expressive of we-intentions is necessary because morality is a specific kind of we-intention: "to intend something under a moral description is to intend something as a member of a moral community and not merely as an individual" (65). Moral judgments express a special class of we-intentions -- namely, those in which the "we" is the community of rational beings generally. Whereas most we-intentions are indexed to some specific group or other, moral judgments are expressive of those we-intentions that we share with rational beings generally. What, then, is the specific content of the we-intention of morality? It is, Koons tells us, nothing other than what Sellars regarded as the supreme principle of morality: "It shallwe be the case that our welfare is maximized" (p. 163). That is, the overarching principle of morality is that we -- where "we" is the community of rational beings -- shall promote our general welfare. (This is one respect in which Sellars took himself to have reconciled deontological and consequentialist ethics.) The idea that we shall promote the general welfare is entailed from the idea that "essential to the moral point of view is that we intend not individually but qua members of the larger moral community" (159). There is no argument from rational egoism to the moral point of view because "rational egoism is self-undermining, as an individual's self-interest is not conceptually separable from the welfare of the community . . . promotion of the community's welfare -- adoption of the moral point of view -- is not optional, nor need it be justified in terms of self-interest" (175).

For Koons, this view holds the line against extreme relativism but with sufficient responsiveness to local variations: universal principles admit of local variation because circumstances and cultures can vary as to what will in fact promote the general welfare. What would promote the general welfare under scarce resources or when one person must sacrifice herself to save others is not what would promote the general welfare when resources are more abundant. (Whether this is sufficient to refute the moral relativist is beyond the scope of this review.)

Although Koons ascribes to Sellars a supreme moral principle, this supreme moral principle is not Given and so does not run afoul of moral foundationalism:

even if there is a sense in which particular moral judgments rest on a master moral principle, this principle cannot serve as a moral regress stopper because there is another dimension in which our particular moral judgments are prior in the order of justification to this master moral principle. (263)

What secures a relation between moral judgment and the world is not that moral judgment rests on a supreme principle that is somehow grounded in the very nature of reality, but rather because -- here building on Kukla and Lance (2014) -- "we are embodied creatures skillfully navigating our physical environment, and hence our practices are essentially, inherently, and ineliminably world-involving" (267). Moral judgments are not connected to the world through pure practical reason but through world-involving embodied habits.

Though Koons argues (successfully, in my view) that Sellars's rational expressivism is a compelling metaethical account, he is not merely explicating Sellars's thought. Rather, there are several key junctures at which he thinks that Sellars is mistaken and needs correcting. First, Koons argues against Sellars's thought that normative discourse is causally reducible to, but logically irreducible to, non-normative discourse (chapter 2); second, he argues that Sellars was mistaken in holding that practical inferences are necessary truths (chapter 6); finally, he argues against Sellars's "mistaken formalism" (chapter 14) according to which particular moral judgments are derived from the supreme principle of morality. I concur with Koons on the second and third points: he is clearly right that Sellars's conception of material inferences as non-necessary, non-monotonic inferences is helpful for understanding practical reasoning, and hence we should think of moral judgments as essentially involving material practical inferences. He is also correct, though Koons's expressivism may be more Brandomian than Sellarsian, that the supreme principle of morality is better understood as expressing what we are already committed to in our substantive particular moral judgments.

With respect to the Sellarsian claim that normative discourse is causally reducible to, but logically irreducible to, non-normative or naturalistic discourse, I am not entirely sure how Koons intends to distinguish causal reducibility (or irreducibility) from logical reducibility (or irreducibility).[1] The argument Koons makes against the causal reducibility of the normative to the natural seems to hinge on semantic considerations: the causal reducibility-cum-logical irreducibility thesis is nothing more, on his account, than the idea that expressions with different intensions can share the same extension. What is true, Koons admits, is that

the irreducibility of normative claims to naturalistic language is merely the irreducibility of the semantic metalanguage to a purely extensional descriptive language . . . we use our language for things besides describing, and those things cannot be reduced to describing or restated as a set of descriptions. (212; emphasis original)

But this does not permit any hope that a future science could eliminate all normative discourse in favor of a description of all human behavior in purely extensional terms. Cogent as this argument is, I worry that causal reducibility is not a semantic concept, but an epistemological one, and more precisely, a concept that belongs to philosophy of science. Koons has made the argument too easy on himself by adopting a semantic conception of the distinction itself between causal reducibility and logical reducibility. To show that intensional discourse is not causally reducible to the vocabulary of the natural sciences, one would need to engage with the relevant literature on reduction in philosophy of science (e.g., Dupre 1993; Horst 2007) and not analytic philosophy of language.

That said, I do agree with Koons that Sellars's larger philosophical ambition is "to accommodate -- via a thoroughgoing nominalism -- the framework of normativity (and of persons more generally) within a strongly scientific worldview" (12).[2] Given this ambition, "even if normative language is not logically reducible to descriptive language, we should be able to tell a story about how following norms is something that is possible for physically describable creatures in a natural environment" (329), which would vindicate the thought that "Sellars's ethical theory is naturalistic precisely because he does away with appeal to causally explanatory moral properties and explains ethical discourse in expressive -- rather than descriptive -- terms" (334).

Richard Rorty once quipped, with regard to Sellars, "if one should bind the spirit of Hegel in the fetters of Carnap, how shall he find readers?" Those familiar with Sellars's theoretical philosophy are well aware of how Hegelian he is (for example, the critique of the Myth of the Given and the essentially social and historical character of epistemic and semantic norms). But it is with Koons that we can now realize that the same is true of Sellars's practical philosophy.[3] In that respect Koons also helps point the way towards how Sellarsian arguments can be brought into conversation with political philosophy (Anderson, Nussbaum) and second-generation critical theory (Habermas, Apel).

As the figure of Sellars is slowly assimilated into the canonical history of analytic philosophy, those working on Sellars run the risk that accompanies all history of philosophy. On the one hand, we can become so intent on a correct understanding of what Aristotle or Kant thought that we lose sight of why their thought should matter to contemporary concerns, and while such scholarship may be valuable (not to mention pleasurable) in its own right, it will only speak to a coterie of specialists. On the other hand, the impulse to connect a philosopher to some contemporary issue, of a "Big Name + ____" variety, can veer towards a lack of sustained engagement with the philosopher whose authority is being borrowed. Koons's work sets a new standard for work on Sellars by showing how to be deeply engaged with the details of his work, willing to correct him when necessary, and also addressing live current issues in contemporary philosophy.


I would like to thank Peter Olen for his helpful comments on a previous draft of this review.


Dupré, John. 1993. The Disorder of Things. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Gilbert, Margaret. 2004. Joint Commitment: How We Make the Social World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Horst, Steven. 2007. Beyond Reduction: Philosophy of Mind and Post-Reductionist Philosophy of Science. New York: Oxford University Press.

Hurley, Patrick. 2000. "Sellars's Ethics: Variations on Kantian Themes". Philosophical Studies 101, no. 2-3: 291-324.

Klemick, Griffin. 2018. "Sellars's Metaethical Quasi-realism." Synthese.

Kukla, Rebecca and Marl Lance. 2014. "Intersubjectivity and Receptive Experience". The Southern Journal of Philosophy 52, no. 1: 22-42.

Miller, Steven. 2018. Community and Loyalty in American Philosophy: Royce, Sellars, and Rorty. New York: Routledge.

Seibt, Johanna. 1990. Properties as Processes: A Synoptic Study of Wilfrid Sellars' Nominalism. Atascadero: Ridgeview.

Olen, Peter and Stephen Turner. 2015. "Durkheim, Sellars, and the Origins of Collective Intentionality." British Journal for the History of Philosophy 23, no. 5: 954-75.

Olen, Peter and Stephen Turner. 2016. "Was Sellars an Error Theorist?" Synthese 193, no. 7 (July): 2053-75.

Tomasello, Michael. 2009. Why We Cooperate. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.

Tuomela, Raimo. 2007. The Philosophy of Sociality: The Shared Point of View. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] This is not to fault Koons; Sellars himself was also unclear and perhaps confused about this issue as well.

[2] Unfortunately Koons does not mention Seibt (1990), perhaps the most rigorous examination and defense of Sellarsian nominalism.

[3] However, Miller (2018) reaches a similar conclusion by a different route.