The Event of the Thing: Derrida's Post-Deconstructive Realism

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Michael Marder, The Event of the Thing: Derrida's Post-Deconstructive Realism, U of Toronto Press, 2009, 186pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780802098924.

Reviewed by Jack Reynolds, La Trobe University and Ricky Sebold, La Trobe University



It has become a pervasive prejudice, in some philosophical circles, that deconstruction is nothing more than some kind of textual or linguistic idealism. After liberating itself from the oppressive hegemony of the ‘real’ world, the text can surrender itself to the infinity of free-play and ignore all questions of faithful representation. Hilary Putnam notes in Renewing Philosophy, for example, that “deconstructionists think that the whole idea of representing reality … needs to be deconstructed” (p. 108). We think that this is incorrect, at least insofar as it purports to represent Derrida’s own views, but, of course, this kind of comment does not come from nowhere. First, we must recognise that Derrida is consistently concerned with the way in which metaphysical realism seems to entail that the world is divided into objects and properties that are represented for metaphysical realism (cf. ‘Sendings — On Representation’), although this is something that also worries the later Putnam. Second, this idealist interpretation that is sometimes championed by the enthusiastic avowals of over-zealous acolytes, is also at least partly based on statements made by Derrida that prima facie give it credence, e.g., “there is nothing outside the text.” It is hence perhaps fair to say that Derrida, like much of contemporary continental philosophy, has a complicated relationship to realism, often attempting to steer a middle-way between idealism and realism, and certainly being wary of epistemic realism (and the correspondence theory of truth), as well as the metaphysical suppositions of naïve realism, but not necessarily anti-realist for all that. Let us simply note here against the charge of linguistic idealism that Derrida has always been interested in that which is other than language, that which is undecontructable, and that his subsequent commentaries on his infamous remark, Il n’y a pas de hors-texte, clearly defuse it of an idealist interpretation (see ‘Afterword’ in Limited Inc.).

In this respect, there has been a concerted effort by some to counter idealist views of deconstruction by presenting a more nuanced understanding and a closer reading of Derrida’s texts. Michael Marder’s The Event of the Thing: Derrida’s Post-Deconstructive Realism is such a book and is therefore a valuable contribution to contemporary Derridian scholarship. In it, Marder argues that Derrida is in fact committed to a form of realism that is unequivocally opposed to the idealism with which he is often charged. He collects a conglomeration of quotes from Derrida to support this reading, and in some ways makes things more difficult for himself by focusing upon the thing, which Marder accepts at one point is “one of the most inconspicuous terms in Derridian philosophy” (p. xv). Although we are sympathetic to Marder’s overall thesis, as well as to the very interesting trajectory on which it takes us (through Derrida’s reflections on death, literature, art, commodity fetishism, Heidegger, etc.), there are some points of contention that we feel obliged to note, especially as they pertain to the contrast between traditional realism and the deconstructive/post-deconstructive realism that the book hinges upon.

In particular, Marder is not entirely explicit as to what he takes traditional realism to entail. Contemporary theories of realism are widely acknowledged to be constituted by two dimensions: (1) existence, and (2) mind-independence. Anti-realism is the general term used to denote anyone who gives up either dimension. Those who give up mind-independence are those who would classically be called idealists. So we might assume that the kind of realism that Marder is concerned about is the one which deals with the mind-independence of things, given that he opposes Derrida to idealism. But then how is Derridian realism different from this standard conception? Marder writes

Derrida’s own deconstructive or post-deconstructive realism is, certainly, not the same as ‘any of the tradition’s realisms,’ be they empirical or transcendental, since at its core is found the split thing, the indwelling of différance, the concrete figure without figure undermining and invalidating the logical principle of identity … [I]ts absolute alterity does not allow the new realism to ossify in a determinate encyclopaedic definition ready to be catalogued in the annals of philosophy, but necessitates its unfolding as a series of discontinuous beginnings and interim, provisional conjunctures. (p. 135-136)

It is the thing’s very nature — a nature that is independent of our conceptions of it — that makes the thing exceed our totalizing grasp, a grasp that is equated with realism. It seems, then, that what Marder is ultimately concerned to distance Derrida from is a kind of epistemic realism that claims that our knowledge of mind-independent things is true — that is, how things are presents itself to consciousness in some kind of immediacy. However, it would be a case of equivocation if this kind of realism were taken to be the same as the metaphysical doctrine — things exist and do so mind-independently — that is the primary focus of discussions on realism, certainly in the analytic tradition. Metaphysical realism is consistent with the view that the ways things are always outruns our ability to represent them. Consequently, the tension that Marder wants to maintain between deconstructive realism and standard realism is not necessarily there.

Furthermore, it would be a mistake to saddle the realist position with doctrines that may be found to be problematic along Derridian lines, e.g., the logical principle of identity. It may be a contingent fact that most realists subscribe to the principle of identity but that does not mean that it is an essential component of realism.

If this is what is meant by realism, then what makes Derrida an enemy of idealism? For Derrida, the thing is an event, which means that the thing always exceeds calculation and prediction.

In keeping with Derrida’s thinking of the event as the impossible arrival of something or someone who/that cannot be recognized as the arrivant she, or he, or it is, these confusions and cross-contaminations madden those who put their faith in the mechanisms of identification and recognition, the mechanisms whose inefficiency disseminates the exact time, place, and meaning of arrival. (p. 4)

Since idealists believe that the thing is dependent on the mind for its existence, then the thing is predetermined to be and behave a certain way (even if in certain views the ‘mind’ itself is inter-subjective and historically variable). This is seen in Kant’s transcendental idealism where in order to have necessary a priori synthetic knowledge, objects are to conform to our forms and concepts, the so-called Copernican revolution. Knowledge is possible because the mind predetermines the structures of objects. However, if the thing necessarily breaks free of constraints and cannot be made to conform, then the idealistic move cannot go through. What makes this impossible is the inherent rift within the object itself. Unlike other transcendental conditions that just determine the possibility of our knowing objects, différance, the double movement of spatial difference and temporal deferring, is the metaphysical ground of things themselves. Things, because of their constitution by différance, always differ and defer from themselves. This is why Marder frequently mentions the alterity of objects to themselves and draws comparisons between Derrida and Levinas in regard to all experience being an experience of alterity. Thus, no act of idealistic constitution can ever contain a thing and force it to submit, without remainder, to the gaze of consciousness. Deconstruction is then, a realism of the remains, a realism of that which resists idealism and will always exceed consciousness, subjectivity, the trancendental ego, etc. What deconstructive realism acknowledges, then, is the life of the thing apart from any sovereign subjectivity. The essential differantial constitution of things always undermines any attempt at mastery. This is what Crispin Wright refers to as the modesty of realism.

Perhaps this is also why poetic language is used extensively in Derrida’s texts. Poetic expressions such as metaphors appear to allow things to exist outside of a rigidified linguistic cage that is often associated with scientific discourse. The naming and classifying of things is taken to be an act that ignores their independence while attempting to gain knowledge. Thus, the poetic, i.e., describing without any determinate object in mind, is often opposed to naming, which tries to isolate a thing and arrest its self-splitting by imposing an identity relationship with itself. Marder notes in this respect:

in lieu of the alliance of naming and mastery, the description that refuses to name endows one with a peculiar attitude toward anonymous things — the attitude that is devoid of mastery and that therefore cultivates a poetic receptivity to the world. (p. 33)

Though, as Marder points out, Derrida by no means prioritizes the poetics of description, what motivates the suspicion of naming is the non-identity of the thing.

So, we think that there are a few confusions and imprecisions in this nonetheless admirable book: firstly, as to just what standard realism is and in just what sense Derrida does not endorse it; secondly, as to just what is the standard view of the thing and identity for most realists, and the sense in which Derrida does or does not endorse them (the book also arguably trades on an equivocation between the regular understanding of ‘thing’ and a deconstructive one). Because of this, it is not entirely clear what it is to be a post-deconstructive realist about the thing, since both ‘realism’ and ‘thing’ are here given unusual interpretations. Marder is perhaps right in implying that Derrida is not a common-sense realist about middle-sized dry goods, say, but just how Derrida diverges from such a view is left unclear. Sure our washing machine exists independently of us, for Derrida, but that doesn’t get us very far into understanding it, and Derrida’s post-Heideggerian view seems to be that there are multiple senses of ‘real’ and, moreover, that a commitment to common-sense realism fails to see the genealogical conditions for what presents itself, or in Marder’s and Deleuze’s terms, the virtual that subsists.

Indeed, it is interesting that the notion of the virtual, a term that Derrida rarely uses (but see Rogues 104-5), is pivotal to Marder’s book and its thematisation of Derrida’s quasi-transcendental position on the thing. The thing differs from itself, is non-identical with itself, and hence seems to contravene the principle of bivalence, which is commonly (albeit not always) associated with metaphysical realism. This differing of the thing from itself is associated with the condition of possibility of an event, but the thing does not take place and has no place to be (p. 17). It is not given to us, present to us, as forms of common-sense epistemic realism might maintain. Marder states:

Circumventing and routeing the principium contradictionis that subtends conceptualism, nominalism and realism, the thing continuously turns inside out and outside in, to the extent that it internally accommodates its other (or even substitutes the athing for itself), and to the extent that it exteriorises this internal unrest, producing virtual, phantomatic effects in the noematic reality of thought (the three ‘isms’) and in the real actuality of the world (p. 21).

One way of putting Derrida and Marder’s point about the thing differing and deferring from itself might be to say somewhat crudely that time is at the heart of things for deconstruction. Marder notes that:

the thing neither realises a past potentiality nor remains presently indeterminate. Rather, it is as if the thing has already occurred and is, virtually, yet to come; its forever suspended quasi-transcendental causality is neither a priori nor a posteriori, since it operates perhaps before and perhaps after the event. Immemorial past, the future to come: perhaps, perhaps (p. 12).

Passages like this point to something important in regard to the status of Derrida’s quasi-transcendental philosophy, as well as the role of time in them. While Derrida is one of the great internal critics of traditional transcendental philosophy (e.g. in Kant, Husserl, Heidegger), he never leaves the transcendental tradition entirely behind either. In Spectres of Marx, and elsewhere, he invokes Hamlet and declares that time is out of joint, describing this as a condition of possibility for any event worthy of the name, and referring to the manner in which waiting is essential to experience, as well as the manner in which every experience contains an aspect of lateness. He also calls this kind of relation to time “anachronism”. Anachronism is an error of sorts, a relating to an event or custom or ritual as if from the wrong time. It suggests someone, or something, is out of harmony with time, the living present. Now there are clearly forms of anachronism that may be problematic — interpreting the past from the perspective of our own current predilections and interests can be anachronistic — but there is also something positive to anachronism for Derrida, to our inability to coincide in time with the thing, as well as for the thing to coincide with itself. Not only is it the condition for the event, but also, in times of crisis (e.g. Hamlet) when the new and potentially violent threatens to erupt in revolutionary crisis, Derrida suggests that one needs to borrow all the more from the past, and to attend to spectres and hauntings (Spectres 109). This might not be in the form of nostalgia for the past, but some kind of spectral or uncanny visitation is required. In his conclusion, Marder invokes such anachronistic reflections when he explains his own move to read Derrida retroactively (through Jean-Luc Nancy) as himself already a post-deconstructive realist (p. 135). Anachronistic or not, we certainly think he is right to distance Derrida from idealism.