The Event Universe: The Revisionary Metaphysics of Alfred North Whitehead

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Leemon B. McHenry, The Event Universe: The Revisionary Metaphysics of Alfred North Whitehead, Edinburgh University Press, 2015, 184pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474400343.

Reviewed by Brian G. Henning, Gonzaga University


After decades of careful and productive philosophical work, it may be that the seams of descriptive metaphysics have been all but mined out. Fortunately, as Leemon B. McHenry beautifully illustrates, after more than a half-century of slumber the speculative impulse has been reawakened. Don't be fooled by the slender dimensions of this volume. McHenry is attempting, fallibly if not immodestly, nothing less than "a general theory of the world" (vii). Building on the work of Bertrand Russell, W. V. O. Quine, and, most especially, Alfred North Whitehead, the author's aim is to frame an event ontology that is fully consistent with contemporary physics, especially physicists' attempts to create a unified theory or so-called Theory of Everything (TOE). For those readers who are eager to place this pigeon in its proper hole, McHenry characterizes his project as revisionary, naturalistic, and realistic.

The position I defend is revisionary because it overthrows our ordinary common-sense modes of thought; naturalistic because it begins to construct metaphysical principles from the natural sciences -- physics and cosmology in particular; and realistic because its naturalism demands the scientist's robust sense of a mind-independent reality as a foundation for enquiry into the nature of the physical world (viii).

The volume opens with a helpful introductory chapter that situates the author's project within the history of twentieth century philosophy and physical cosmology, starting with the work of three Cambridge philosophers, Whitehead, Russell, and C. D. Broad. McHenry notes that early in the century all three philosophers developed event ontologies in conversation with the emerging relativity theory (2). However, with the ascent of logical positivism in the 1930s the interest in ontology waned. "Cool analysis was in; grand speculation was out" (2). A significant aim of McHenry's historical situating is to highlight differing views on the relationship between science and metaphysics. He contends that, while descriptive metaphysics views "philosophical enquiry as a sort of self-contained activity of conceptual analysis immune to revision by science," revisionary metaphysics, on the other hand, views "metaphysics as the general end of theory on a continuum with science" (5). McHenry contends that these differing attitudes toward science bring the former to embrace a substance ontology and the latter an event ontology. Specifically, because it is "an indispensable part of the conceptual scheme of common sense," descriptive metaphysics conceives of substance as a "basic class of entity" (5). On the other hand, if one starts as Whitehead does with the evidence of physics provided by the likes of Maxwell, Einstein, and Heisenberg, then ordinary language and common sense are of little use. "Revisionary metaphysicians reserve the right to overthrow our common-sense categories in the effort to construct a comprehensive, unified scheme that is consistent with advancing science" (5). Thus, McHenry contends, it is the attempt to construct a metaphysics that is adequate to the discoveries of electromagnetism, relativity theory, and, later, quantum mechanics, that makes a compelling case for the rejection of a substance ontology in favor of an event ontology.

As McHenry rightly notes, this close relationship between science and metaphysics makes the speculative impulse of contemporary revisionary metaphysics importantly different than the grand system builders of the past. As he colorfully puts it, the "metaphysical megalomania in the likes of Descartes, Spinoza, Hegel and Bradley is thereby cured by a naturalised approach inspired by the American pragmatists, Pierce, James and Dewey. The quest for certainty is abandoned both in philosophy and science" (5).[1] Pierce and Whitehead are particularly good examples of this new approach to speculative philosophy, according to which a metaphysical theory is seen as a "working hypothesis" that should continually be tested for its applicability and adequacy to concrete experience.

Conceived in this manner, metaphysics as 'first philosophy' must surrender its traditional claim to a truth beyond the empirical realm of scientific investigation. A plea for open systems replaces the alleged finality of absolute principles or the sacrosanct status of the common-sense conceptual scheme (8).

On this model, both physics and metaphysics do not attempt to create closed, necessary, apodictic systems of truths immune to revision, but they conduct fallible, open-ended pursuit of ever-more-adequate accounts of reality.

In his second chapter, McHenry focuses more deeply on what he sees as the flawed ontological assumptions of descriptive metaphysics. Specifically, he traces the roots of the "descriptive enterprise" (11) back to Aristotle's substance metaphysics, which defines individuals in terms of their independence. As Aristotle puts it in his Categories, a substance is that which is neither said of (predicated) nor in another. McHenry notes that many proponents of descriptive metaphysics, such as Peter Strawson, ultimately ground their project in a substance ontology.

Strawson, for example, in his Individuals (1959), explicitly acknowledges the importance of these characterisations when he attempts to identify basic particulars, first in terms of ontological commitment via identifiability, and then in terms of his defence of two criteria for the subject-predicate distinction, the 'grammatical' criterion and the 'category' criterion. He says he defends the 'traditional doctrine' that 'particulars can appear in discourse as subjects only, never predicates; whereas universals, or non-particulars generally, can appear either as subjects or as predicates' (15).

McHenry contends that it is this embrace of the traditional, Aristotelian conception of substance that brings Strawson to subordinate events and processes to substantial things. Events are merely activities of substances (15). In contrast, McHenry's goal is to follow and defend Whitehead, Russell, and Quine's "broad view" of events, according to which

events are the only concrete or basic particulars and substance is eliminated as an unnecessary substratum. The concern of the anti-event metaphysicians gets reversed; instead of eliminating events to keep our ontology tidy, we eliminate substances (16).

That such an event ontology chafes against our ordinary language and our common sense experience of the world is undeniable. However, as McHenry rightly notes, it is equally undeniable that our ordinary language and common sense are a product of a very narrow range of sensible experience at our particular temporal and spatial scales. Since at least the advent of crude telescopes and microscopes, what has been revealed is a world far stranger and more dynamic than our unaided senses perceives. In particular, the microscopic world beyond our senses is a booming, buzzing, confusion of energetic pulses that are far more adequately understood as fleeting events than as enduring substances.

Furthermore, McHenry points out, there is reason to wonder whether the subject-predicate form of "our" ordinary language isn't already biasing us toward a substance ontology. Indeed, he approvingly cites Tsu-Lin Mei's argument that philosophers like Strawson may be guilty of a form of "linguistic imperialism" because

he takes English as the paradigm for all languages. Since Chinese does not admit a distinction between subject and predicate, the so-called conceptual scheme of ordinary language describes at most 'a fact peculiar to Indo-European languages and has no further philosophical significance' (1961: 153) (25).

The implication is that, according to McHenry's revisionary event ontology, the relationship of events and objects is reversed. "Events are energetic activities interrelated in such a way as to form a network or field of relations; objects such as electrons, atoms, molecules and the like are disturbances or vibrations in the field. They are all patterns discernible in event-sequences" (29).

Having exposed some of the weaknesses of descriptive ontology, in the third chapter McHenry turns to the positive work of cataloging the physical evidence in support of his event ontology. I am not sufficiently expert in the physical science to evaluate the adequacy or accuracy of his treatment of the state of physics and cosmology. However, from the standpoint of an interested metaphysician, I find McHenry's descriptions of the developments of physics -- from Maxwell's electromagnetic field theory in the nineteenth century through contemporary quantum mechanics -- to be admirably lucid, striking that difficult balance between precision and clarity. The upshot of this discussion for McHenry is that modern physics lays bare the fundamental inadequacy of substance ontology. Reality is not best conceived along the lines of classical mechanics with substances of a definite size, shape, and position. Rather, it seems that our reality is better understood as "pulses of energy that have an approximate location in space-time and interact in fields that bear and transmit the forces of nature" (44). The role that philosophers such as Whitehead, Russell, and Quine can play is in helping providing additional intellectual tools needed to move closer toward a final unified theory. That is the task of the fourth chapter.

Chapter four is the heart of the project. It is here that McHenry carefully considers the affinities and contrasts in the event theories advanced by Whitehead, Russell, and Quine respectively. Whitehead's early event ontology and later process ontology are the backbone of McHenry's project, as implied by the subtitle of the work. Admirably avoiding the scholastic habits of some Whitehead scholars, the author explains Whitehead's complex metaphysics in clear language with a minimum of technical jargon. Realizing the significance of Maxwell's work, which was the subject of his doctoral thesis, and in reaction Einstein's theories of relativity, Whitehead proposed an event ontology according to which

Everything in the universe from medium-size dry goods to planets and galaxies, is interpreted as patterns of properties that are repeated in event sequences. 'Things', as we ordinarily understand them, are postulated by Whitehead to be relatively monotonous patterns in events (51).

The advantage of Whitehead's approach is that it provides an ontology that can coherently explain and unify the macroscopic world that we inhabit with the microscopic world of the physicist.

 McHenry turns next to Russell and his "neutral monism" or the view that "the ultimate stuff of the universe consists of neutral events, which are the common ancestors of mind and matter" (63). McHenry notes that Russell himself admits to owing much to Whitehead, his teacher and collaborator.[2] The comparison of Whitehead's process ontology and Russell's neutral monism is helpful especially since the contrast makes the former, less-well-known theory more clear. The same can be said of the subsequent comparison of Whitehead with Quine, who was also a student of Whitehead's.[3] According to McHenry,

While Quine found much with which to agree in Whitehead's four-dimensionalism, he could not accept the idea that properties are legitimate parts of the ontology of science. Whitehead's ontology is dualistic, containing events and properties (which he called 'objects'). Quine's ontology is also dualistic, containing events (which he also calls 'physical objects') and classes (66).

By providing detailed and clear comparisons of the event ontologies of Whitehead, Russell, and Quine, this chapter alone may make this volume worth the purchase, especially for analytic philosophers who have wanted to learn more about Whitehead's process metaphysics but have so far been intimidated by the prospect of confronting his Process and Reality.

The fifth chapter explores connections between Whitehead's metaphysics and contemporary cosmology by examining his theory of extension. McHenry notes that although Whitehead knew nothing of Big Bang theory or post-Hubble cosmology, "in a rather uncanny manner his theory of cosmic epochs anticipates what has become the most challenging development in contemporary cosmological theory, namely the multiverse hypothesis" (74-75). Again it is not possible for this reviewer to judge the accuracy of the treatment from the standpoint of physical cosmology. However, from the standpoint of metaphysics I find McHenry's analysis to be in equal measures clear and insightful. He recognizes that "Whitehead's theory of cosmic epochs might very well appear quaint to the physicist steeped in contemporary string theory or inflationary cosmology" (85). However, McHenry argues convincingly that the value of Whitehead's project is not that it gets all of the details of physics right, but that the general metaphysical architecture that he erects helps one imagine a coherent multiverse theory.

Moving beyond the multiverse hypothesis, the penultimate chapter takes up the problem of time and the need for a unified theory for this present universe as its focus. McHenry contends that eliminating substances in favor of events is a critical first step toward developing a unification of general relativity and quantum mechanics. In particular, he defends "a version of C. D. Broad's growing block universe consistent with Whitehead's late metaphysics and relativistic quantum field theory" (87). Rejecting the orthodox instrumentalism of the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics, according to which everything proceeds deterministically until a measurement is made, McHenry recognizes that the probabilistic character of the quantum world must be brought together with a genuine realism (90).

McHenry's final chapter looks beyond physics to the broader philosophical implications of adopting an event ontology, specifically: the mind-body problem; perception and causation; personal identity; and free will. Readers interested in these topics will find helpful, if not exhaustive discussions of the implications of an event ontology for these perennial philosophical problems.

One of the valuable contributions of McHenry's book is that it serves as a response to the consistently ignorant statements of some theoretical physicists regarding the irrelevance of philosophy.[4] Steven Weinberg, Stephen Hawking, Neil deGrasse Tyson and others would do well to take to heart McHenry's claim that "Physics without speculation is sterile. Some metaphysical daring is required to break the spell of custom and conjure fresh perspectives -- ones that will need to be formulated specifically and result in the possibility of testing to be taken seriously" (86). I can think of no better way to conclude this review than to quote from Quine's own 1995 letter regarding McHenry's proposal for the present project: "The ambitious project which he now envisages is of precisely the sort that I like to picture as the next flowering of philosophy and science: a merging of rigorous, logically sophisticated methodology and ontology with the physicists' findings and quandaries in cosmology and quantum mechanics" (ix). There is ample reason to believe that this volume merits Quine's praise.

[1] In the interest of disclosure it should be noted that I've defended a similar claim in a recent essay, Brian G. Henning, "Recovering the Adventure of Ideas: In Defense of Metaphysics as Revisable, Systematic, Speculative Philosophy," Journal of Speculative Philosophy 29.4 (2015): 437-456.

[2] A team led by Nicholas Griffin are undertaking the difficult process of editing Russell and Whitehead's correspondence surrounding their collaboration on Principia Mathematica. This volume will be part of the Edinburgh Critical Edition of the Complete Works of Alfred North Whitehead.

[3] The Critical Edition of Whitehead, of which I am Executive Editor, is anticipating publishing Quine's lecture notes of Whitehead's classes, as well as an interview that Quine did of Whitehead while a student at Harvard University.

[4] In addition to the references that McHenry makes to Weinberg can be added Hawking's recent claim in The Grand Design that "philosophy is dead" and Tyson's flippant claim that philosophy is "useless." See Massimo Pigliucci's blog for a helpful discussion of the latter.