The Event

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Martin Heidegger, The Event, Richard Rojcewicz (tr.), Indiana University Press, 2013, 311pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253006868.

Reviewed by Miguel de Beistegui, Univeristy of Warwick


The Event is the sixth of a series of seven treatises written between 1936 and 1944, and published posthumously in the third section of the Gesamtausgabe, entitled "Private Monographs and Lectures." All of them are specifically and intimately connected with the first and most important of the series, Contributions to Philosophy: On Ereignis, written between 1936-38 and published as volume 65 of the Complete Works. The series will be complete when the seventh and final volume, Die Stege des Anfangs (The Paths of the Beginning) (GA72), is finally published. Thanks to the publication of those books, we now have a good picture of the transformation that Heidegger's thought underwent in the 1930s, and of the key term around which it is organised, namely, "the event," or "the event of appropriation" (das Ereignis). The Event is thus a further piece of the puzzle that Heidegger began to construct in Contributions, although most of the themes and central notions developed in The Event can already be found in previous treatises from the same period.

The book is made up of eleven chapters, varying in length between five and sixty pages, and 386 sections, many of which are just a few lines long and often bear the same title. Yet Heidegger's "sayings" aren't aphorisms, or fragments for that matter. They read more like private thoughts, arranged according to various headings, which were never meant to lead to a systematic treatise. As with the previous books of the same period, the dominant impression on the part of the reader is one of a thought that does not unfold in a linear way, but through a series of repetitions, brief forays into unchartered territory, turns and loops. This, at times, leads to confusion, and makes the task of the translator very difficult. On many occasions, and in line with the experimental and esoteric nature of the previous volumes, Heidegger's language stretches the German grammar and syntax to the limit.

The translation is reliable and does a good job at not rendering Heidegger's language more opaque than it already is. Still, some decisions can be disputed. I had problems with Inständigkeit as "steadfastness" (rather than "insistence"), Austrag as "enduring" (rather than "bearing"), or Anklang as "resonating" (rather than "echo" or "trace"). In each instance, however, one can understand why Richard Rojcewicz made those decisions. In any event, the very useful German-English and English-German glossary inserted at the end is an encouragement for everyone to test the validity of the translation, as well as the limits of any translation.

The Event unfolds under the banner of blindness, and it is no coincidence that the volume as a whole opens with the following verses from Sophocles' Oedipus at Colonus (vv. 73-74):

And what, from a man who cannot look, is the warrant?
Whatever we might say, we see in all that we say.

The blindness in question, which Heidegger fought all his life, and the overturning and twisting free of which he intimates and meditates in The Event under the rubric of "the other beginning," consists in the forgetting of being, of its truth or essence, and in the consummation of that forgetting in contemporary science and technology, that is, in the triumph of human beings' ability to take hold of the world, control and dominate it entirely from a secure ground:

Human beings themselves, like the organized superman, seem to dominate everything and are dispropriated of the last possibility of their essence: they can never recognize in the extreme blindness that the human forgetfulness of being, a forgetfulness brought to maturity along with the abandonment of beings by being, leaves human beings without a sense of plight insofar as it compels them to think that the ordering of beings and the instituting of order would bring about the substantive fullness of beings, whereas indeed what is assured everywhere is only the endlessly self-expanding emptiness of devastation. (141; my emphasis)

By contrast, the "other" beginning envisages human beings from the point of view of the truth or clearing (Lichtung) of beyng. It marks this turning in which truth, or unconcealedness, is envisaged from its essence, that is, concealedness, and this in such a way as to be sheltered or harboured in the very presencing of beings. But this "sheltering" is not be confused with the securing of a ground or foundation (Grund), which is the "cessation of truth" (196). The Event (Ereignis) itself, prior to designating the proper and the own (eigen), signals the showing (Er-eigen) and bringing into view (Er-eugen, Eraügen) of what lights up and shows itself. It signals the end of the blindness that has struck the Western eye.

Yet, reading the manuscripts from that period, one cannot forget that they were written during the Second World War, and at the height of Nazism. It's a period in which many "events" took place. Yet anyone hoping to see Heidegger discuss or even mention such events will be disappointed. It's true that anyone who's read Heidegger's texts from that period knows better, and knows that the Event in question cannot be reduced to any specific empirical event. Rather, the event names history as the horizon of presence and experience, but history is itself the essential unfolding and clearing of beyng in its difference from beings. That said, Heidegger refers on occasion to actual, empirical events which he either witnessed or anticipated in his lifetime: in section 111, he mentions "the global [and desperate] cry for wheat and gasoline," which he contrasts with the "joyful grief" of Hölderlin's "bread and wine;" he imagines (and anticipates) the future of Europe (and of the world) as a unified bureaucracy for which the planet is essentially a set of goods and values to be exchanged, and in which human beings are reduced to being "human resources;" and he also foresees the construction of the atom bomb and the possible annihilation of the planet as a whole. In sections 131-138, he distinguishes between Europe, as the technological project of "planetary domination," which extends and projects itself far beyond its geographical boarders, and includes the Soviet Union as well as America, and what he calls the West, or das Abendland, the land of the evening from which the dawn of a new beginning rises, and the promise of an altogether different kind of history can be intimated. In that context, he also contrasts the "will to willing," which has taken hold of the European mind, and which as lead to the "degradation of humans and destruction of their bearing" (98), with the "leap" into the truth (and abyss) of being.

There is no doubt that, when writing about the "devastation" (Verwüstung) and the "decadence" (Untergang) of Europe, Heidegger is attempting to provide a context within which to think the historical events unfolding at the time, and in which he even took an active (and regrettable) part. Yet the devastation in question is never one that he explicitly links with the horrors of Nazism and the war. It is not, to use Levinas' expression, "the hatred of the other man," the imperialism, the racism, and the destructive frenzy of Nazi Germany, or that of Stalinism for that matter, which he has in mind. Similarly, the "pain" that he mentions throughout, and the "courage of steadfastness [Inständigkeit]" it requires, don't refer to the concrete situation of Germany and Europe at the time. Or, to be more specific, it's possibly that destructiveness and that pain that he has in mind, but not precisely as an ethical or political problem. That's because the human being exists in relation to beyng first and foremost, because the being of the human being belongs to the event of appropriation (Ereignis): "to see the human being humanly (humanistically, humanely, anthropologically) and even all-too-humanly ("psychologically") means to experience nothing of the human being" (78). As a result, the phenomenon he describes is, he believes, much broader, and its roots are much deeper: the devastation coincides with "the abandonment [of beings] by being" (p. 63) and "appears in the form of the swiftest and widest progress in all planning and calculating" (85). The event in question is historical in the onto-destinal sense of the term. Devastation designates the unconditional "will to order" and "will to power" that takes hold of the planet as a whole, including human beings. Similarly, the pain at issue is the pain experienced in the departure from beyng (210), or in the remoteness of the human being from its own essence, and not that experienced by the millions of civilians who were persecuted, humiliated and killed.

The unfolding of the Event is what Heidegger calls metaphysics. To be more precise: metaphysics is an episode of the Event, which unfolds over many centuries, "between the first and the other beginning" (148), and is being consummated in the total actuality, availability and predictability of beings, or in "the obsession with beings and the indifference toward being" (p. 68). Because metaphysics knows only the truth of beings, and understands truth as objective correctness, it cannot experience the truth of beyng. It is constantly questioning beings, from the point of view of their what, why, how, whither and whence, of their causes, production, representation, and content. But it never questions them from the point of view of what is genuinely worthy of questioning, and which transforms the very sense of questioning. For when, Heidegger tells us, thinking is directed towards beyng, and appreciates what is question-worthy in questioning, it becomes thanking (Denken) (242).

But this does not mean that the age of metaphysics -- our age -- is generated by metaphysicians. Rather, metaphysics, understood as the turning away from the essential unfolding of beyng (as withdrawal), manifests itself in various ways throughout history, as the metaphysical text, but also and subsequently, as science, machination, and technology. But metaphysics doesn't exhaust history. History is also eventful, resourceful, and holds in reserve, at the same time and from the very start, the possibility of another history, beyond calculation, domination and exploitation, beyond questioning even (205). There is another beginning harboured within the first, and waiting to be released. The "overcoming" (Überwindung) of metaphysics, which needs to be understood as a "twisting free" (Verwindung) of metaphysics, is itself an event of beyng and a turning within its history, one that is always imminent, despite the apparent distance separating the total forgetting of being in metaphysics and thinking as nearness to the truth of being. Thinking is then no longer questioning as such, but the experience of the lack of ground, the enduring (Austrag) of the originary and ineliminable difference or differentiation: "Today thinking must think in a startling way so as to jolt humans for the very first time into the passion of thinking and to compel them to learn, and exercise, the differentiation" (217). Thinking then takes the form of the "care of the abyss" (220), of an affirmation that precedes all questioning (205).

Given this, we can wonder whether Heidegger's account of history isn't circular: history unfolds as metaphysics, and metaphysics as machination and technology; yet the only way into the truth of history as metaphysics is through the history of philosophy. In the end, the clue to understanding history is provided by the metaphysical text, and Heidegger's ability to bring out its "unthought." In the end, Heidegger doesn't look outside the metaphysical text in order to make sense of history. But, we may wonder, is the understanding of history reducible, as Heidegger seems to suggest, to the empirical history of historians on the one hand, and to the onto-destinal history of Heidegger, on the other hand? Or could one imagine a philosophical account of the event that would escape the (philosophical) distinction between the (merely) empirical, or ontical, and the purely transcendental of the seinsgeschichtlich?

I began by noting that The Event unfolds under the banner of blindness, and went on to describe how Heidegger understands the blindness that has taken hold of humanity, and the ways in which it might be reversed. But there is perhaps another form blindness, to which Heidegger himself, in his effort to see beings from the point of view of beyng, fell prey, and which, as a result, provides an ironic twist to his opening citation from Oedipus at Colonus. For everything happens as if, in his effort to learn to see that which, of itself, but especially in the contemporary context, reveals itself only reluctantly, and only indirectly, Heidegger had been led to another form of blindness, one that could be described as ethical and political, and which he refused to acknowledge as philosophically relevant. Everything happens as if, in order to shake the scales off one eye, he had to close, or even poke the other, and thus endure himself the fate of Oedipus. In his obsession that we "have an eye for 'being'" or "the truth of beings" (xxiii), he became blind to the actual suffering and pain not of human beings in general, but of those who were persecuted by the German state. All the sections and passages devoted to dispositions (Stimmungen) are, in that respect, exemplary, in that they are thought "on the basis of the experience of beyng" and in relation to the history of beyng: section 188 ("Event and Compassion") introduces compassion (Rührung) as an "inceptual" or originary "disposition," and as the ability to care, to experience sadness and sorrow -- not for other human beings, but for beyng. Similarly, "the nobility of human beings" consists in "their appropriation into the truth of beyng" (183), and not in their ability to care for others. Finally, "courage" is the courage to endure "the pain of the question-worthiness of beyng" and to reply to "the voice of the dignity of beyng" (188). The blindness in question led him to lend his unconditional support to Nazism in 1933-34, and subsequently remain blind to a number of events unfolding at the time. There are events, it seems, that Heidegger was simply unable to see or recognise as such, events that, from the point of view of the history of beyng, were simply non-events, events that others -- including philosophers -- not only recognised, but also did something about. To the question: "what should we 'do'?" which he raises on p. 86, Heidegger responds: demonstrate "steadfastness," which, for him, means "questioning" and "thinking."

Another response, formulated at exactly the same time, came from the French philosopher of mathematics and logician Jean Cavaillès. A philosopher of the concept in the very sense that Heidegger associates with "the extreme end of metaphysics," and thus entirely blind to the truth of beyng, he was nonetheless entirely lucid about the abomination of Nazi Germany, and acted accordingly, precisely at the time when Heidegger was writing The Event. He co-founded the resistance movement Libération-Sud in 1941 and set up the intelligence network Cohors-Asturies. He was tortured by the Gestapo in 1943, and shot in 1944. His philosophy of the concept didn't stop him from acting steadfastly. It may have even helped. This is what, reading the following passage from The Event, we could refer to as the historical irony of the concept:

In the modern age, through calculative thinking we have long ago become accustomed to seeing in thinking, and demanding from thinking, grip [Zugriff], grasp [Griff], and concept [Begriff], i.e., we understand the "concept" on the basis of a grasping: conceptus (33).

A few pages later, Heidegger adds: "Capere: grasp, capture, seize, hunt down" (43). He simply confused the concept and the Gestapo.

In the end, there is something tragic about Heidegger's extraordinary fate as a philosopher. He is the philosopher who teaches us to see that which no other before him had seen, who opens our eyes to a dimension of human experience and history that is always implicitly there, at work, yet always looked over, ignored, and at a cost. At the same time, he is the philosopher who simply could not see the pain, the injustice, the inhumanity that had taken hold of Europe during his life time, and which philosophy needs to meditate, integrate, make its own. Can one draw those two lessons from Heidegger, lend him one eye, but one eye only, and leave the other one open for justice and decency, for history in a way that's reducible to neither historiology nor historicality?