The Everlasting Check: Hume on Miracles

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Alexander George, The Everlasting Check: Hume on Miracles, Harvard University Press, 2016, 98pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674289246.

Reviewed by Kenneth P. Winkler, Yale University


This lovely book -- wise, humane, brief, and beautifully written -- offers both a sympathetic reconstruction of Hume's argument concerning miracles and a series of illuminating reflections on the argument's nature and significance. The book is an ideal point of entry into the argument for students and general readers, but scholars too will find that it gives them plenty to learn from -- as well as plenty to contend with.

In chapter 1, Alexander George explains how Hume understands "miracle." Hume defines a miracle as "a violation of the laws of nature" ("Of Miracles," section 10, paragraph 12 in An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding), but George advises us to "turn away . . . from Hume's explicit definitions," at least at first, so that we can attend more closely to the way in which he actually uses the term (3). In use, George contends, a Humean miracle is not a violation of a true law of nature, but a violation of "a well-confirmed candidate for such a law" (3). Hence Hume's conception of miracle is resolutely "epistemic" (3). How well-confirmed must the candidate law that a miracle violates be? George's answer is that it must be superbly well-confirmed: "We judge a claim to be a law of nature," he explains, "only when we take the evidence to support it beyond a shadow of a doubt" (7). Superbly well-confirmed laws are backed by what Hume calls proofs, and "a proof," George explains, "consists of empirical evidence of a very high order" (3). Appeals to shadows of doubt and high orders of evidence may seem vague, but elsewhere, George draws a very clear line between proofs and what Hume regards as mere probabilities. "A miracle, as Hume uses the term," George writes, "is an event that conflicts with some lawlike claim that is supported by uniform observations of nature" (55). How uniform is uniform? At times, Hume treats uniformity as a matter of degree. (I believe this is true throughout Enquiry 8, for example.) But in "Of Miracles," uniformity generally seems to be perfect uniformity -- an impression George seems to share, because he tells us that according to Hume, we take all Fs are Gs to be a law only when experience "[fails] to provide us with evidence that 'Fx and not-Gx' holds for any value of x" (6). According to George, then, superbly well-confirmed candidate laws are supported by perfectly uniform observations. Proofs can vary in evidential force, it should be observed, even if they are all exception-free. Some proofs may call upon on a larger number of positive instances than others, for example, or rest on tighter or more perfect analogies among the instances they call upon.

In chapter 2, George reconstructs Hume's argument concerning miracles by means of two "lemmas" and a "theorem." Hume states and defends the first lemma, George explains, in part 1 of section 10:

First Lemma: If the falsehood of testimony on behalf of an alleged miraculous event is not "more miraculous" than the event itself, then it is not rational to believe in the occurrence of that event on the basis of that testimony. (11, 14, 19)

A second lemma is defended in part 2:

Second Lemma: The falsehood of testimony on behalf of an alleged miraculous event of a religious nature is not "more miraculous" than the event itself. (19)

From these lemmas Hume draws his conclusion:

Hume's Theorem: It is not rational to believe on the basis of testimony that a miracle of a religious nature has occurred. (9)

George makes useful observations about both lemmas, but he is especially helpful on the first. More important than Hume's arguments for the lemma, George compellingly proposes, are his efforts to make the lemma "intelligible in the first place" (15; see also 12-13). By cashing out the evidential force of testimony in the coin of observed regularities between "talk and truth" (13), Hume renders the evidence for a miracle "commensurable" with the evidence arrayed against it (16). Only then, when the evidence pro and con has a common measure, can the comparison urged on us by Hume's first lemma easily take place.

Chapter 3 proposes that Hume's argument, which George aptly describes as the "weighing argument" (33), can be recast as an argument that accepting a miracle on the basis of testimony is epistemically or evidentially "self-undermining" (33). "If we conclude that Jesus was resurrected," for example, "then in effect we shall be declaring the evidential irrelevance of experience," George writes, because experience tells us that dead men do not return to life (33). Yet "our only basis for crediting testimony at all is experiential" (34). "Hence," George concludes on Hume's behalf, "our inclining to the miracle deprives us of all reason to believe that it ever occurred" (34).

In chapter 4 George explores Hume's understanding of the gathering of testimony. It may seem that Hume is advising us to search for correlations between testimonial speech acts on the one hand ("talk") and the facts they report on the other ("truth"), just as we search for correlations between natural signs (such as darkening skies or strengthening winds) and the events that follow them. But speech acts require interpretation, and "sprinkled throughout Hume's writings," George discovers "intriguing remarks that suggest [Hume] well understood that some measure of reasonableness and correctness on the part of one's testifier is . . . an artifact of the process of working out what he is testifying to" (47). Wary interpreters, in other words, will rely on what we now call a principle of charity (46). They will "avoid imputing . . . beliefs that are obviously inconsistent, or that demonstrate confusion about obvious conceptual connections, or that display ignorance of such obvious facts about the world as to amount to spectacular stupidity" (49).

In chapter 5 George addresses a series of objections to Hume. His aim, as he explains in the book's preface, is not "to defend Hume . . . against all objections," but to demonstrate the "interest and power of his argument" (xii). George does this very effectively. One well-known objection is that Hume's argument is at odds with his discovery that we have no reason for supposing that the future will be like the past -- and therefore, perhaps, no reason for accepting any of our inductive expectations. George replies that to judge that someone who stands outside the practice of induction can be given no reason for entering into it is not to say that arguments made by those already within the practice are irrational or bad (67). He concludes the chapter by discussing a related point, which he attributes to Samuel Johnson: even if miracles cannot provide a way into religious belief or practice to those who stand outside it, someone already on the inside may be able to judge -- and judge fairly -- that the belief or practice is, as Johnson puts it, "proved" by a miracle (69, 73).

This theme -- the difference between opening a door to a practice and "proving" or confirming it to those who are already part of it -- is taken up in chapter 6, where George, inspired by Wittgenstein, brings forward an objection of his own. He questions Hume's assimilation of beliefs in miracles to beliefs in what Wittgenstein calls "ordinary historic facts" (89). If a believer's inferences from testimony are (in words once again borrowed from Wittgenstein) as "exceedingly flimsy" as Hume alleges, then we should, in George's own words, "pause before we attribute it to anyone" (89). As George notes, this is to rely on a principle of charity akin to the one that is credited to Hume in chapter 4. The "patent flimsiness of the inference," George says in pressing the point, is simply "too great to make sense of someone's taking it seriously" (90). As Wittgenstein declares, "For a blunder, that's too big" (quoted on 92). On this basis, George suggests that Hume is "confused," that he "court[s] mystification," and that he undergoes "a kind of self-undermining," because his uncharitable imputation pulls the rug out from under his only basis for attributing belief (91). Hume's mistake, George thinks, is taking religious propositions "simply," as "claims . . . completely on a par with those made by the scientist or the historian" (93). The book concludes with the following words:

Once this step was taken, [Hume's] philosophical genius was unleashed to yield analyses and arguments that have absorbed readers for centuries. But in this last chapter, we have focused on his first, almost invisible step. And we have considered whether, in taking it, Hume set off on a brilliant walk on a dark path. (93)

I propose to spend the rest of this review trying to temper the verdict George delivers here. To me it seems unduly harsh. I do not think Hume was a pioneer in taking the step that George describes, or that the step was in any way hidden or invisible. The path of taking religious propositions simply had already been traveled -- more than that, it had been beaten down and firmly packed -- by generations of religious apologists who came before Hume. They included Cudworth, Arnauld and Nicole, Locke, Tillotson, Bentley, Stillingfleet, Clarke, and Butler, to name just a few. Hume follows in their footsteps so that he can reach them, take them by the elbow, and apply the "check" that gives George's book its title -- a check that is "everlasting" less because it will be everlastingly effective than because it will be everlastingly required, as Hume wryly predicts (Enquiry 10, paragraph 2).

There are several indications in Hume's writings that the rationalizing of religion (including even revealed religion) was a cultural phenomenon he came upon, rather than something for which he was responsible. The most arresting is a remark made by Cleanthes in part 1, paragraph 17 of the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion:

Locke seems to have been the first Christian who ventured openly to assert, that faith was nothing but a species of reason; that religion was only a branch of philosophy; and that a chain of arguments, similar to that which established any truth in morals, politics, or physics, was always employed in discovering all the principles of theology, natural and revealed.

If Philo is correct, Locke was an extreme and unusually frank representative of an apologetic tradition that was, by the time Hume wrote and took it as his target, already well-established. In the Enquiry, Hume defines this target as "all the religion, which is nothing but a species of philosophy" (section 11, paragraph 27). His target in the Enquiry is not religion, period (a target that is indeed "too big" to be taken down or even much rattled by the means at a philosopher's disposal), but religion insofar as it is has been rendered or represented as a rationalized system of belief.

That Hume is responding to an already well-established tradition makes me hesitate to accept George's suggestion that Hume's working conception of a miracle is an epistemic one. Most (but admittedly not all) of the figures I've identified understood "miracle" non-epistemically. They took miracles to be violations of the actual laws (or actual course) of nature. Doing so gave them easy passage along the following line of thought: testimony (as reported in scripture) gives us evidence that a miracle has occurred; because a miracle is a violation of nature's laws or nature's course, the reported miracle has no natural cause; the cause of the miracle must therefore be supernatural or divine; and thus we are entitled to conclude that the person associated with the miracle speaks with divine authority. We can safely trust what he or she reveals. In spelling out central elements of this way of thinking in a fashion typical of his tradition, William Sherlock, Dean of St. Paul's, makes it clear that Hume blazed no trail when he took religious propositions simply:

If we allow the Resurrection of our Saviour to be an unquestionable Miracle, that is, what is above the Power of any natural Cause, and must be attributed to the immediate Power of God; it gives us the same sort of Evidence for the divine Authority of our Saviour, and the Truth of all his Promises, which we have for the Being of God by mere natural Reason. (A Discourse concerning the Happiness of Good Men, part one [London: W. Rogers, 1704], 360)

This way of thinking had a scriptural foundation, as many pointed out; it was, they often suggested, the line of thought that Moses, in turning his rod into a serpent, tried to trigger in the mind of the Pharaoh. It is this train of thought that Hume sets out to derail in "Of Miracles." (This is why the essay's opening and closing paragraphs speak of miracles as proofs or signs of divine authority.) Because Hume is responding to this line of thought, he falls in with its predominantly non-epistemic understanding of "miracle," as his explicit definitions attest.

George gives three reasons for thinking that Hume's notion of miracle is, in use, epistemic, but I did not find them persuasive. His first reason is that in Hume's view, "the crucial consideration in determining whether an event is a miracle is whether it conflicts with a very well-confirmed regularity" (3). But I don't see why the experience favoring a law can't be a crucial epistemic consideration -- a crucial test of our right to apply the appellation "miracle" -- even if miracles themselves are non-epistemically understood. (In the tradition I've identified, miracles were sometimes defined in a mixed way, as violations of the known laws of nature. George doesn't consider this possibility, but it may give us all that we could hope for: a definition of "miracle" that is, like Hume's, significantly non-epistemic, but one with built-in epistemic bearing.)

George's second reason is that Hume speaks of some events as being "more miraculous" than others. On a non-epistemic understanding, George suggests, such a "graduated conception" makes little sense (4). I wonder, though, whether Hume takes the phrase as seriously as George does. If we replace "more miraculous" with "more improbable" throughout George's reconstruction, it seems to me that nothing would be lost. (Hume suggests this substitution in the paragraph introducing the first lemma [section 10, paragraph 13]. "More marvelous" may be a second acceptable substitute.)

George's final reason is that on a non-epistemic conception, "from an event's being a miracle, nothing could be inferred about the strength of our evidence against the correctness of testimony on its behalf" (5). After all, he adds, "we may have no idea that a given statement expresses a law of nature and so no idea that some particular event, which indeed violates it, is a miracle" (5). But if Hume is responding to opponents who claim to know (or reasonably believe) that specific violations of nature's laws have actually taken place, can't we put this worry aside?

In trying to temper George's final verdict on Hume, I've been suggesting that his argument is more ad hominem that George acknowledges. Hume's target was not too big for a blunder, because his opponents had already cut it down to size.