The Evidence For God: Religious Knowledge Reexamined

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Paul K. Moser, The Evidence For God: Religious Knowledge Reexamined, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 280pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521736282.

Reviewed by Thomas D. Senor, The University of Arkansas


Taking up where 2008's The Elusive God left off, The Evidence for God is Paul Moser's second book in his attempt to reorient religious epistemology. As with the earlier volume, The Evidence for God is daring and provocative. Among the important topics it deals with are naturalism, fideism, natural theology, and the role that volition plays in our ascertaining evidence of God's existence.

The book begins with a parable around which the entire monograph revolves. Imagine that you are hiking in a vast and remote wilderness area that is accessible only to hikers. To your great dismay, you discover that you are hopelessly lost: you have no method of determining either your exact location or a promising route back to civilization. The woods are filled with dangers (e.g., poisonous snakes, hungry carnivores, and potentially freezing temperatures) and you have no means of communication with the outside world. Worse still, you have only a meager supply of food and water. You've had one bit of good fortune: you've come across an old, dilapidated shack that contains a barely functional ham radio. The battery in the radio still has a bit of juice, although you doubt it will last long once the radio is turned on. In short, your situation is dire but not hopeless. What is your best bet for survival?

According to Moser, what is needed is a trustworthy guide. Merely finding maps won't get you out of your predicament since you don't know how to place yourself on them -- you don't know where you are. To increase the chances of success, the guide should be capable of interacting with you as you are making your way out of the wilderness since you will likely make a wrong turn somewhere and you'll need to be put straight.

Given your predicament, Moser claims, you've got four primary options.

Option 1: Despairing

Seeing the hard road in front of you with at best a chance of rescue, you might just decide to give up. To do this is to be a practical atheist regarding a rescuer.

Option 2: Passively Waiting

Another option is not to give up hope but to stay put and simply wait for rescue. You could just bide your time and hope to be discovered. Being reasonable, you don't believe you'll be saved but you don't disbelieve either. As such, you become a practical agnostic about a rescuer.

Option 3: Leaping

The leaping option involves picking a path or direction, following it, and hoping for the best. One might focus on the goods involved in following a trail that other hikers have trod rather than on the result of rescue. In any event, the key here is action without evidence that the action will lead to the ultimate, desired end. Moser calls one who leaps a "practical fideist."

Option 4: Discerning Evidence

As opposed to the first three options, the fourth involves rationing the available food supply and taking a hard, rational look at your situation. Within the "discerning evidence" camp, two rather different approaches may be detected:

1. Purpose-neutral discerning of evidence: look for evidence of how to best find rescue that doesn't involve or presuppose the purposes of any potential rescuer.

2. Telic discerning of evidence: look for evidence that seems purposive. For example, whereas purpose-neutral evidence might be the shapes, lines, and textures of a map of the region, telic evidence would be markings on the map by an agent with an intention to guide the lost to safety.

Moser's idea is this: humanity is lost in a figurative wilderness: here's how Moser puts it:

we all face the prospect of ultimate physical death and social breakdown. From the perspective of our species overall, our food and water supplies are threateningly low, with little hope of being adequately replenished. On many fronts, our relationships with one another are unraveling, and have resulted in selfish factions and fights. The factions and fights often involve race, religion, nationality, or economic class but they sometimes cut across familiar lines. Selfishness transcends common categories, always, of course, for the sake of selfishness. We have become willing even to sacrifice the minimal well-being of others for our own selfish ends. As a result, economic injustices abound among us, wherever a sizeable group resides. Accordingly, genuine community has broken down on various fronts, and, in the absence of a rescuer, we shall all soon perish, whether rich or poor. (12-13)

The possibility of a rescuer for humanity depends on the possibility of a being both capable and willing to save us. The primary matter of the book is to "use the wilderness parable to examine, without needless abstraction, the main approaches to knowledge of God's existence" (15).

The approaches that Moser discusses are four: nontheistic naturalism, fideism, natural theology, and his preferred "personifying evidence of God" model. Having argued against the primary claims of the former perspectives and delineating his own position, Moser concludes the book with a chapter on potential defeaters, and in particular examines the epistemic impact of religious pluralism. In what follows, I'll sketch his discussion of each of these chapters and take issue with a couple points along the way.

Chapter 1 undertakes to examine whether appeals to the findings and nature of science undermine the rationality of belief in God. If naturalism is true, and if what it is for an object to be natural is for it to be (in principle) understandable via empirical science, then there is clearly no God, traditionally conceived. But why should we think that metaphysical naturalism is true? Whether or not there are good arguments for naturalism, empirical science itself would not seem to provide them.

Furthermore, Moser argues that a thorough-going naturalism would demand that purposive explanation (i.e., explanation that appeals to the intentions or purposes of agents) be eliminated, reduced, or somehow shown to be accounted for by non-intentional, non-purposive explanations. Yet the prima facie plausibility (indeed, ubiquity) of intentional explanation makes it very hard to see how to do without it; and no good reductions are yet on the table.

Moser concludes Chapter 1 with a dilemma for what he calls "Core Scientism," which is roughly the dual claim that every real entity knowable via (a completed) science, and every epistemically acceptable way of forming and revising beliefs, is grounded in the objects acknowledged by and the methods of (a completed) science. Either Core Scientism is itself not included in the sciences or its justification depends on a proper understanding of the nature of "empirical science." If the former, then the thesis is self-defeating for it asserts that only that which is knowable or justified via science is epistemically acceptable and yet it fails to meet this condition. If the latter, then it is being laid down simply as a desideratum of the proper understanding of "empirical science," in which case it is simply stipulative and innocuous.

Moser concludes that the empirical sciences and the epistemology they employ are barriers neither to the existence of non-natural entities (e.g., God) nor to the possibility of reasonable belief about them.

In Chapter 2, Moser turns his attention in a radically different direction. If the first chapter represents the pessimism of the lost hiker who thinks there is no hope of rescue and resigns himself to his fate, the second chapter focuses on the one whose hope manifests itself in blind action. The fideist is the believer who eschews evidence and who emphasizes the importance of faith as opposed to knowledge or even justified belief. Søren Kierkegaard is the primary example that Moser offers but he also includes Rudolf Bultmann and Karl Barth in the fideistic camp. The fideist believes not just that it is in some important sense permissible for the believer to lack supporting evidence for the existence of God but that true faith requires an existential leap from a springboard other than a solid evidential base. The subjectivity of religious devotion requires a lack of objectivity; arguments and reason are the source of the objectivity that is rejected by faith.

Why is there conflict between faith and reason? Moser proposes that, at least for Kierkegaard, it is the content of faith that produces the tension. Faith, or at least Christian faith, is incompatible with well-grounded belief because what is believed is "inherently paradoxical, contradictory, or absurd." (101) Moser takes Kierkegaard at his word when he uses this kind of language and thinks that Kierkegaard takes the faith that he holds to be necessarily false. So the picture Moser paints of fideism is not simply the claim that religious belief without evidence is morally or epistemically or religiously appropriate, but rather the much stronger claim that reason can't have anything to do with Christian faith since the latter is contradictory (because the doctrine of the Incarnation is contradictory) and hence necessarily false.

Moser contrasts the fideistic view of faith with what he labels "Christian faith." In the second half of this chapter, and in much of the last two-thirds of the book, the discussion leans heavily in the direction of biblical exegesis rather than analytic philosophy. This is never more true than with respect to Moser's presentation of his preferred view of faith. According to Moser, the Christian view of faith is, essentially, "a willing, obedient entrustment to God that involves one's motivational heart and that therefore is inherently action oriented" (105). In calling people to faith, God seeks not only to move us cognitively and emotionally, but volitionally as well. When the believer entrusts herself to God, God works cooperatively with her to transform her from the default position of selfishness to being an expression of God's perfect love. Thus, while there is a doxastic component to faith, there is also a crucial volitional component.

The fideism chapter includes a discussion of Alvin Plantinga's Reformed epistemology, which Moser includes under the more general category of "argument-indifferent theism." Moser finds a number of things not to like in Plantinga's epistemology of religious belief. He objects that on Plantinga's view, belief in the specific claims of Christianity is "caused" by the Holy Spirit and that this is inconsistent with the New Testament perspective that faith is a gift freely offered to all who have the ability to freely accept or reject it. However, the main difficulty that Moser has with Plantinga's view is simply that it is an instance of argument-indifferent theism, and thus it does not require that the believer possess "a trustworthy truth indicator for a belief" (140).

In the end, Moser rejects fideism because he understands it to recommend an arbitrary and, in the case of the Kierkegaardian view, contradictory faith. In keeping with the guiding metaphor of the book, the best chance of getting out of the woods is not by blindly choosing a path (particularly if you can tell immediately that the path goes nowhere!) but instead by finding trustworthy evidence that the selected route will lead to safety.

Chapter 3 takes on the epistemic significance of natural theology. Moser begins the chapter with a discussion leading to the claim that God's goal is to call people into a non-coercive relationship with God that will lead to the moral development and transformation of those who heed the call. The primary problems that Moser has with natural theology are two. First, the arguments fall short of arguing for a perfectly loving God. Cosmological arguments might lead to a first cause or ultimate explanation and teleological arguments might secure intelligence, but neither of these forms of reasoning can support the claim that the intelligent cause of the universe is a perfectly loving God. Moser thinks the ontological argument fails for reasons we don't have the space to discuss. But even if it didn't have the flaw that Moser cites, he still thinks it wouldn't be adequate since the concept involved

is static in a way that the personally interactive occurrent evidence of the presence and the reality of the Jewish and Christian God is not. In particular, the evidence consisting of the content of a concept of God is not personally variable relative to the wills of humans toward God and God's will. As a result, the evidence offered in ontological arguments fails to fit with the personally interactive divine self-revelation that involves God's intermittent hiding and seeking relative to humans. (157-158)

The trouble with the arguments, then, is that they provide the wrong kind of evidence. A God who wants to enter into dynamic, personal relationships with creatures will reveal himself in a way that invites creatures to enter more deeply into the relationship. A one-size-fits-all, impersonal model of evidence is not what we should expect given what we have reason to believe are God's purposes.

In Chapter 4 we get an argument for the existence of God that doesn't pretend to be natural theology traditionally construed. After claiming that the personifying evidence would require God's altering our volitional structure (with our permission) so that we would not remain in the condition of sin that makes our default will one of selfishness and hence unreceptive to moving in the direction of "unselfish love and forgiveness toward all persons" (204), Moser offers the following argument which he claims is for him -- and presumably others who have heeded the call -- a good argument since he has reasons for thinking that the premises are true.

1. Necessarily, if a human person is offered and receives the transformative gift, then this is the result of the authoritative power of a divine X of thoroughgoing forgiveness, fellowship in perfect love, worthiness of worship, and triumphant hope (namely, God).

2. I have been offered, and have willingly received, the transformative gift.

3. Therefore God exists.

What is the "transformative gift"? Although the definition is rather robust, understanding the argument requires understanding it so it's worth the space we devote to it:

The transformative gift =df one's being authoritatively convicted in conscience and forgiven by X of sin and thereby being authoritatively called into volitional fellowship with X in perfect love and into rightful worship toward X as worthy of worship and, on that basis, transformed by X from default tendencies to selfishness and despair to a new volitional center with a default position of unselfish love, including forgiveness, toward all people and of hope in the triumph of good over evil by X. (200)

Given this understanding of the transformative gift, premise one of the argument is presumably secure: for one is not in a position to offer the gift unless one is capable of forgiving sin and is worship-worthy. But given just how propositionally rich the definition of the transformative gift is, the second premise will require significant justification (to say the least). For I'm justified in believing that premise only if I'm justified in believing the following conjunctive proposition: I have been authoritatively convicted in conscience & forgiven of sin & called into a volitional fellowship in perfect love & due to the previous conjuncts, transformed from selfishness and despair to a new volitional center of unselfish love and forgiveness, and hope in the triumph of good over evil & the one who has offered this to me is capable of forgiving sin and worthy of worship.

The argument is clearly valid; in fact, the conclusion follows from the second premise alone. The question then is how, on Moser's view, is premise two justified? Given what Moser said in response to Plantinga (and in keeping with his general epistemological predilections), he'll have to hold that there are internally accessible signs of trustworthiness in order for the belief to be justified. The belief's being reliably grounded, say, will be insufficient. So what kinds of grounds does he have for holding that premise two is true?

Moser writes:

I could plausibly argue for the cognitive well-groundedness, or trustworthiness, of premise 2 on the basis of its central role in an undefeated best-available explanation of the whole range of my experience and my other evidence. This role includes this premise's figuring in a best-available answer to the following explanation-seeking question: why is my experience regarding the supposed provisions of the transformative gift (including my evident change from default selfishness to a new volitional center with a default position of unselfish love toward all people) as it actually is now, rather than the opposite or at very least different? On the basis of my experiential evidence, the central role of premise 2 in answering such an explanation-seeking question can figure in its being well-grounded for me and for anyone else who has similar evidence. (205-6)

So premise two is to be justified by an inference to the best explanation of "the whole range" of the believer's experience and other evidence. But what precisely is the nature of the experience that is the ground of so significant an abductive inference? We get hints here and there but if we are looking for a robust, phenomenological characterization and philosophical exploration of the mode of evidence we receive and how it is that we are able to receive it, we'll be disappointed.

According to Moser, we can have "direct, firsthand knowledge of God's reality and character" by "being acquainted with (at least) God's personal and perfectly loving will" (201). But what is it to be acquainted with perfect, unselfish love? Although Moser has a fair bit to say about the point of contact and the effects of such acquaintance (e.g., the conscience is a focal point for receiving a direct divine volitional challenge, that being acquainted with such love is to be acquainted with "God's inherent personal character and thus with the reality of God" (201), that such acquaintance can noncoercively lead to one's will being changed from selfishness to unselfish love of others, etc.), we never get anything that looks like a philosophical account of the nature of this kind of evidence. To be clear, I'm not implying that we should be given enlightening necessary and sufficient conditions for when human acquaintance with the divine takes place. Nor am I suggesting that we should be provided with epistemically useful rules for determining when such acquaintance is achieved. But if we are to think that this experience is evidence for the existence of God, we need to know better how to conceptualize its evidential role.

A natural thought is that such acquaintance involves perceptual or at least quasi-perceptual experience. Yet except for his frequent use of "acquaintance," Moser gives no reason to think this -- there is no discussion of perception or even of mystical religious experience which might be at least quasi-perceptual. How we can have knowledge by acquaintance (as opposed to description) without having perceptual contact with that which is known is not addressed and is, to my mind, problematic.

Here is another interpretation of the experiential evidence that figures prominently in Moser's religious epistemology: the experience is the recognition of the change in one's volitional center. One sees that one is now inclined toward love for others rather than selfishness. One's will has been altered for the better in ways that seem to be unnatural -- at least in the sense that my natural default position has been moved away from selfishness and toward perfect love. This volitional change is in need of explanation and the best explanation is that it is the result of my having received the transformational gift.

Although there is no doubt that this recognition has a role to play in Moser's defense of premise two of his argument, it can't be all the experiential ("personifying") evidence that the believer has. For if it were, there would be no inclination to call a mere recognition of a volitional shift an "acquaintance" with God. This surely implies, as Moser says elsewhere, "direct, firsthand" experience of God. And if it were the only role that experiential evidence plays, then premise two will not be justified. For it surely can't be reasonably argued that my noticing a surprising change for the better in my will by itself justifies the belief that I have been offered and received the transformational gift (recall that it entails the sizable and robust conjunction described above).

Despite a long and interesting discussion of the theological and biblical account of the nature of, and challenges to, volitional change, we never do get an epistemologically illuminating discussion of acquaintance and of the personifying, experiential evidence that one gets as one positively responds to the divine offer.

The Evidence for God's concluding chapter tackles the primary potential defeaters for the justification of premise two: the problems of evil and of religious diversity. Although there is no room here to discuss the details of this chapter, I will say that Moser's discussion of diversity (which takes up most of the chapter) is bold, innovative, and nuanced. While defending a version of exclusivism, Moser argues that a God of perfect love could not make belief a requirement of salvation, and that one might yield to God's transforming call de re and fail to form any beliefs about having yielded to God or even about the existence of God.

Moser's book is an interesting read that furthers his agenda in the epistemology of religious belief. If Moser has in mind making this work a trilogy, I would suggest that he use William Alston's book Perceiving God as a model: that is, I'd like to see him lay out more explicitly the epistemology of personifying evidence and tie it in with modes of evidential justification with which we are all familiar.