The Evident Connexion: Hume on Personal Identity

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Galen Strawson, The Evident Connexion: Hume on Personal Identity, Oxford University Press, 2011, 165pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199608508.

Reviewed by Donald C. Ainslie, University of Toronto


Among historians of philosophy, Galen Strawson is renowned -- or notorious -- for espousing what has come to be called the "New Hume" interpretation. It holds that David Hume is a causal realist, committed to there being intrinsic, deep necessary connections between causes and their effects in the natural world, even if we cannot know them. Strawson is not alone in reading Hume along these lines (John P. Wright[1] and Peter Kail[2] are two other notable New Humeans), but Kenneth Winkler,[3] Peter Millican,[4]and others have offered persuasive rebuttals of this position over the past 20 years.[5] They appeal to the "Old Hume" who uses his theory of ideas, where all thoughts must ultimately be traced back to prior experiences (or impressions), to show that we cannot even conceive of such deep connections. This is not to say that their Hume is a dogmatist, who thinks that the nature of the world is circumscribed by our cognitive capacities. For the Old Hume admits that there might be qualities in objects quite unlike any we are familiar with, though he rejects any attempt to characterize these qualities.

Strawson's The Evident Connexion: Hume on Personal Identity is a sequel of sorts to his earlier The Secret Connexion: Causation, Realism, and David Hume,[6] and it extends the New Humeanism about causation defended in the earlier book to a new New Humeanism about the mind. Hume, according to Strawson, is not properly understood as a metaphysical bundle theorist, who reduces the mind to a mere bundle of perceptions, just as he is not properly understood as a metaphysical regularity theorist about causation. Instead, though epistemologically all we can know of the mind is the bundle of perceptions, Hume remains committed to an essence of the mind that ties these perceptions together into a real unity -- or so Strawson insists.

Strawson's strategies in the new book echo those he relied on in his earlier work on Hume's account of causation, and indeed the first part of this slim volume is a recapitulation of his approach to Hume's philosophy. One strategy is an appeal to lines of text where Hume seems to allow that there is a kind of deep structure to the world, even if it is inaccessible to us. Strawson particularly likes his statement in the "Introduction" to the Treatise: "the essence of the mind [is] equally unknown to us with that of external bodies. . . . any hypothesis, that pretends to discover the ultimate original qualities of human nature, ought at first to be rejected as presumptuous and chimerical"[7] (Strawson uses the first clause as an epigraph for Part 1 of the book and he later admits that he will use it as a "constant refrain" [15] -- and he does!). A second strategy holds that the Old Humean interpretation, by identifying the mind with a bundle of perceptions, leaves Hume as a dogmatist, and thus fails to comport with his commitment to scepticism (47). The third strategy is a reading of Hume's theory of ideas that rejects the suggestion that it is meant as a "completely general account of mental content," holding instead that it is "an account of empirically warranted, philosophically respectable content" (14). Strawson concludes that the assertions he relies on when pursuing the first strategy can be read literally, so that Hume means to allow that we can think of real connections and real natures that go beyond what philosophy can countenance.

I think that each strategy is flawed. Consider the first one, where Strawson appeals to isolated sentences in order to bolster his case. The problem is that Hume is notoriously loose with his terms and even goes so far as to admit that sometimes his assertions are exaggerations (T, SBN 274). Interpreters must be wary to think that one or two sentences on their own offer decisive support for (or an argument against) a particular reading. Thus Strawson's favourite quotation about the mind's essence must be balanced with those texts, such as the "Abstract" to the Treatise, where he pairs "essence" with "substance," as "altogether insignificant" (T Abs.7, SBN 649). Similarly, in "Of the antient philosophy" (T 1.4.3) Hume shows that "false" philosophers appeal to such notions only by being under the "illusion" that their words have meanings (T, 10; SBN 222, 224). Strawson might try to use his third strategy to take these points to be limited to the significance of these terms for philosophy, holding that we still have an obscure idea of essences that allows us to recognize our ignorance of the mind's fundamental nature. The problem is that this claim is itself philosophical (indeed, it is Locke's, with whom Strawson's Hume shares much in common), and yet it is in philosophy that even Stawson admits the theory of ideas has bite. My inclination would be to see Hume, in the "Introduction," initially presenting his theory as consonant with Locke's only to lull his readers into going along with him until he can demolish it in his later rejection of representational realism in "Of the scepticism with regard to the senses" (T, SBN 210-218).[8]

Strawson's second strategy in The Evident Connexion is to suggest that Old Humean readers, who take him to be a bundle theorist, leave him as a dogmatist, rather than a sceptic. The problem here is that Hume's scepticism is itself contested terrain, and there is no easy way to rule out a position without also giving us what Strawson omits: a careful account of the sense of his "moderate" or "true" scepticism. One constraint on such an account is that Hume does not worry about sounding like a rather ambitious metaphysician on occasion, most notably in his account of space and time. He argues there that, because our spatial and temporal perceptions are only finitely divisible (T 1.2.1), space and time themselves must also be only finitely divisible (T 1.2.2). I have argued elsewhere[9] that this claim is not nearly as extreme as it first seems because Hume ultimately restricts it to "appearances" rather than things in "their real nature and operations" (T, SBN 638-639). I take the world of appearances to be the world as it appears from the human perspective. We can, however, think of the world absolutely independently from how things seem to us even if we cannot say anything substantive about it. For that which is "specifically different from our perceptions" (T, SBN 68) can only be gestured towards by means of negation (T, SBN 15): It is unlike anything we can conceive. Hume needs to have the resources to recognize that his modest scepticism limits us to addressing topics within our "human capacity" (T, SBN 639), but his whole point, at least as I see it, is that we cannot say anything about how things are if we try to "carry our enquiry beyond the appearances of objects to the senses" (T, SBN 639). Strawson uses this passage as part of an argument that the Humean sceptic never "doubts that more exists than is given in experience" (54). But I think this overstates Hume's point: It is that more might exist. And it certainly rules out our assuming that this 'more' (if it does exist) can be characterized by our concepts (even our unclear ones, such as 'nature' or 'essence'), for it is defined as that which escapes our ways of thinking.

Strawson's third strategy aims to avoid this line of argument by restricting Hume's use of the theory of ideas. Where most interpreters take Hume to be committed to tracing all ideas back to simple impressions (though there are exceptional cases like the missing shade of blue [T, SBN 5-6]), Strawson insists that he intends this procedure only to be relevant to philosophy, where we are supposedly interested in "certainty" (21). The problem for Strawson is that Hume spends significant amounts of time explaining the complicated ways in which ideas ultimately get their content from prior impressions in philosophy and in common life. Thus he shows not only how our "fictional" ideas of persisting unobserved objects occur in the mind of the vulgar (T 43 SBN 199-210) but also how we prefer concealed insults to those that are given to our faces (T, SBN 150-153). Hume's project is to "explain the nature and the principles of the human mind" (T, SBN 8), and his core method is to show how beliefs ultimately stem from experience, no matter how obscure or confused those ideas might be.

Part 3 of the Evident Connexion is devoted to Hume's famous and enigmatic rejection, in the "Appendix" to the Treatise, of his earlier account of personal identity. Hume worries that he has failed to "explain the principles, that unite our successive perceptions in our thought or consciousness" (T App.20, SBN 636). In particular, there is an inconsistency between two of his core commitments: that every perception is distinct from every other and that we are unable to recognize "real connexions" between distinct objects (T App.21, SBN 636). The problem for interpreters is that these principles do not seem inconsistent and, if they were inconsistent, they would threaten more than merely the account of personal identity given their centrality to Hume's project in the Treatise.

Strawson's suggestion is that Hume comes to realize that his principles of association require a "ground" (105) -- something that underlies the tendency of ideas to appear in certain characteristic patterns. Hume admits that the existence of a substantial unity or of intrinsic connections between perceptions would solve the problem he raises in the "Appendix," but neither can be countenanced within his empiricism (T App.21, SBN 636). Strawson is right that, were Hume worried about a ground for the principles of association, these two options would serve. One criterion widely recognized for any successful interpretation of the "Appendix" requires that the options provide an escape from the contradiction as interpreted. But it is only one criterion.

Another arises from the fact that Hume takes the problem he identifies in the "Appendix" to be the one "very considerable mistake" (T App.1, SBN 623) in all of Books 1 and 2 of the Treatise. If Strawson is right and Hume has come to worry about the grounds for the principles of association, it seems he should reject almost all of what he has written. For his use of these principles is, as he says in the "Abstract," what entitles him to "so glorious a name as that of an inventor" (T Abs.35, SBN 661). So Strawson's suggested interpretation cannot be right. Hume's principles do not need such a ground and instead the association of ideas can be treated as a brute fact. Strawson considers this possibility, and gives credit to Don Garrett for having pressed him on it (121-2, 147-50). His response is simply to dig in his heels, insisting that Hume's allowing that either substantial inherence or real connections would solve his problem means that he cannot be satisfied with leaving the association of ideas as brute facts (121, 138, 153).

Beyond his interpretation's attributing to Hume a problem that would ramify widely beyond the single mistake he acknowledges, Strawson also makes two related assumptions about Hume's treatment of personal identity that undermine his approach. First, he declares that Hume is not interested in how impressions -- passions and sensations -- are taken to be unified with the rest of our perceptions (141n53). But Hume acknowledges that "intimate entry" into himself reveals that the "perpetual flux and movement" of perceptions result in part from our eyes turning in their sockets and bombarding us with new impressions (T, SBN 252). His question is why we believe the mind to be unified even when we observe this flux within.

Strawson's second mistake is assuming that Hume's explanation for our belief in the unity of the mind involves our "feel[ing] our past experiences to be connected together" (101). This is not what Hume says in the passage Strawson aims to be explicating. Instead he says that our ideas of our perceptions are felt to "naturally introduce each other" (T App.20, SBN 635). That is, Hume's concern in his account of personal identity is to explain what happens when we "observe" (T, SBN 252) our mental states, both ideas and impressions, by forming what he calls "secondary" ideas of them (T, SBN 6). Just as the association of ideas of parts of a table cause us to believe that the table is unified at a time and through time, the association of introspective ideas of perceptions cause us to believe that the mind is unified at a time and through time. Strawson seems to think that Hume's problem has to do with the grounds for the association of ideas in the non-introspective situation like our interactions with the table. But Hume's concern is with the association of ideas in "reflected thought or perception" (T App.20, SBN 635) -- the association of reflective ideas of base-level perceptions. Because those perceptions either resemble one another or are causally linked to one another, our ideas of these perceptions are associated, and we come to believe that these perceptions are a unified mind "when we reflect upon them" (T, SBN 260). I have argued elsewhere that Hume's problem in the "Appendix" is not that of finding a ground for the principles of association, but rather that of explaining how we can believe that the secondary ideas he appeals to in explaining our belief in the unity of mind are themselves part of the mind.[10]

Strawson overlooks the problem secondary ideas pose for Hume, I think, because in the middle portion of the book, he assumes that Hume holds the "Awareness of Awareness" thesis, so that every mental state "involves or is inevitably accompanied by some sort of awareness (consciousness) of that awareness (consciousness)" (89). He offers very little in the way of textual support for the attribution of this thesis to Hume, and does not seem to worry that it flies in the face of much of what Hume says in "Of scepticism with regard to the senses" (T 1.4.2), where sensations are said to be "single existences," making us aware solely of their contents, rather than a kind of "double existence" that would involve our being aware both of their contents and our awareness of them (T, SBN 189-90). Strawson also seems to be far too blithe in his assumption that we know what 'consciousness' means for Hume in a historical context in which the term was highly ambiguous; Samuel Clarke says that it could have up to five different meanings.[11] The closest Hume comes to a definition of 'consciousness' is in the contested passage in the "Appendix" where he identifies it with "reflected thought or perception" (T App.20, SBN 635), namely the secondary ideas of perceptions that arise when we introspectively enter into ourselves. It follows that we are rarely conscious in this sense, most of the time having perceptions and thereby being aware of their contents without being aware of them as perceptions.

Millican, in his criticism of the New Humean position on causation, points out that it assimilates Hume to Locke, and thus misses out on the most innovative aspects of Hume's project.[12] Similarly in the case of Strawson's New Humeanism about personal identity: by taking Hume to accept what is ultimately a Lockean thesis about a consciousness that accompanies every mental state, Strawson overlooks the core of Hume's project. Our minds are bundles of perceptions, without a unifying conscious mental subject superintending or unifying them. This claim is not meant to violate his moderate scepticism, for Hume is describing the "appearances" -- in this case the introspective appearances -- and, as was the case with his metaphysics of space and time, he refuses to say anything about that which "exceed[s] all human capacity" (T, SBN 639).

The New Humeans about causation helped to focus our understanding on a range of issues in Hume's philosophy -- from his theory of representation to his metaphysics -- even if they failed to persuade most scholars. Strawson's new book contains challenges and insights on a new range of issues in Hume's philosophy, especially his theory of perceptions, but I was unpersuaded by its core claims.

[1] The Sceptical Realism of David Hume (Minnesota University Press, 1983).

[2] Projection and Realism in Hume's Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 2007).

[3] "The New Hume," The Philosophical Review 100 (1991), 541-579.

[4] "Hume, Causal Realism, and Causal Science," Mind 118 (2009), 647-712.

[5] See the essays collected in Rupert Read and Kenneth Richman (eds), The New Hume Debate, rev. edn (Routledge, 2007).

[6] Clarendon Press, 1989.

[7] David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature: A Critical Edition, Vol. 1, David F. Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds), (Clarendon Press, 2007), "Introduction," paragraph 8; and L. A. Selby-Bigge (ed.); 2nd edn, P. H. Nidditch (ed.), (Clarendon Press, 1978), xvii. Hereafter I will refer to the Treatise parenthetically as 'T' followed by Book, Part, Section and paragraph numbers (as given in the Norton and Norton edition), followed by 'SBN' and the page number as given in the Selby-Bigge and Nidditch edition.

[8] A different approach to interpreting this passage in the "Introduction" would be to read 'essence' not as a technical term with its roots in the ancients, but rather as an admission that our empirical knowledge of the mind and the world is limited. Winkler takes something like this approach in his initial article criticizing the New Hume, where he points out that Hume can posit unobserved causes not because he thinks there are deep intrinsic causal connections in nature, but because he thinks that experience has shown that surface regularities are often the result of regularities of objects that we are at present unable to observe (547-548). The essence is unknown only in that we have no reason to think that the regularities we do recognize are not themselves products of further regularities. And this does not require that we posit metaphysically real essences. Strawson, however, does not take up concerns like Winkler's and indeed leaves the critics of the New Hume almost entirely unaddressed, never citing Winkler's work on this topic (he briefly responds to Millican in two footnotes, 110n12 and 63n51).

[9] "Adequate Ideas and Modest Scepticism in Hume's Metaphysics of Space," Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 92 (2010), 39-67.

[10] "Hume's Reflections on the Simplicity and Identity of Mind," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 62 (2001), 557-578.

[11] "[E]ither the Reflex Act, by which a Man knows his Thoughts to be his own Thoughts; (which is the strict and properest Sense of the Word;) or the Direct Act of Thinking; or the Power or Capacity of Thinking; or (which is of the same Import,) simple Sensation; or the Power of Self-Motion, or of beginning Motion by the Will." A Letter to Mr. Dodwell; Wherein All Arguments in his Epistolary Discourse Against the Immortality of the Soul Are Particularly Answered, and the Judgment of the Fathers Concerning that Matter Truly Represented. Together With a Defence of an Argument Made Use of in the Above-mentioned Letter to Mr. Dodwell, to Prove the Immateriality and Natural Immortality of the Soul. In Four Letters to the Author of Some Remarks, &c. To Which is Added, Some Reflections on that Part of a Book Called Amyntor, Which Relates to the Writings of the Primitive Fathers, and the Canon of the New Testament, 6th edn (James and John Knapton, 1731), 177n.

[12] "Hume, Causal Realism, and Causal Science," 703.