The Evil Within: Why We Need Moral Philosophy

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Diane Jeske, The Evil Within: Why We Need Moral Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2018, 280pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190685379.

Reviewed by Christian B. Miller, Wake Forest University


In the preface to her book, Diane Jeske describes how the book grew out of her course on evil at the University of Iowa, the teaching of which "has been one of the most rewarding experiences of my twenty-give years as a professional philosopher" (x). That enthusiasm carries over to her lively, accessible, and largely plausible treatment of leading issues in meta-ethics and normative ethical theory. Written for a general audience, the book could be used fruitfully in introductory and upper-division ethics courses. With its engaging style and focus on case studies, it can also profitably be read in a single afternoon by anyone eager to learn more about moral philosophy.

Jeske states a variety of different goals for the book:

  • To "enliven and make accessible issues in moral philosophy" (x).
  • To contribute in some way towards the formation of citizens "who can think for themselves, and can enter into civil debates on complex moral issues with others who have opposing positions, citizens who can analyze arguments, and perhaps most important, see when no argument has been forthcoming" (xi).
  • To help in "figuring out what we actually believe and why we believe it" and to engage in "self-examination" (xii).
  • To recognize that we could "under the 'right' circumstances, become a perpetrator of evil" and to hope that we can "collectively prevent such 'right' conditions from ever being realized" (xii).
  • To identify mistakes in moral reasoning "of which we ourselves are or can be guilty" and to use moral philosophy as a tool "for identifying and avoiding these types of mistakes" (8-9).

These are certainly highly commendable goals, and to varying degrees she is successful in realizing all of them. In order to achieve them, Jeske does not stay at the level of abstract moral theorizing. Rather, in what is the most original and engaging aspect of the book, she provides the reader with five very detailed cases studies that ground and inform the subsequent discussion of issues in moral philosophy.

Jeske writes that "My case studies involve three Nazis, two slaveholders, and one psychopathic serial killer" (21-22):

The Three Nazis: Albert Speer (Hitler's minister of armaments), Franz Stangl (the commandant of Treblinka), and Rudolf Höss (the commandant of Auschwitz).

The Two Slaveholders: Thomas Jefferson (during his retirement years) and Charles Colcock Jones (a Christian minister and Southern slaveholder during the 1800s).

The Serial Killer: Ted Bundy (responsible for killing at least 35 women and girls).

Although certainly not the most uplifting read, Jeske does a great job of adding texture and complexity to their lives, while also using the case studies to inform her discussion of a wide variety of issues in moral philosophy. Ultimately, Jeske hopes that "My real-life historical narratives serve as detailed thought experiments that allow us to put ourselves, through empathetic imagining, into situations of moral crisis" (21).

The book is divided into seven chapters. Chapter 1 begins by focusing on Jefferson's exchange with Edward Coles, who intended to emancipate his own slaves, move them all to the free territory of Illinois, and help them get established on farms. Coles hoped to have Jefferson's support for this plan, but Jefferson opposed it and in general did little to advance the cause of emancipation during his retirement years. The rest of the chapter clarifies Jeske's aim (really aims) in writing the book and what she means by 'moral reasoning.' She also claims, following Tom Hill, that we have a duty of due care in moral deliberation, a duty of moral self-scrutiny, and a duty to develop moral virtue. Four impediments to moral reasoning are also distinguished: cultural norms and pressures, the complexity of consequences, emotion, and self-deception. She takes up each of these impediments in a later chapter.

Chapter 2 is devoted to giving the reader plenty of important and interesting details about the men in the other four case studies.  Chapter 3 focuses on meta-ethics, using Jefferson as the central case study. Jeske's target is the moral relativist, in particular the advocate of cultural relativism understood as follows:

Cultural Relativism: For person S to judge that X is right (or good) is for S to judge that X is approved of by members of the relevant culture. (82)

She rejects cultural relativism, and much of her discussion is devoted to critiquing well-known arguments by Mackie, Harman, and Wolf.

Chapter 4 turns to normative ethical theory, with Franz Stangl as the main case study. Specifically, Jeske focuses on the debate between deontology and consequentialism, the latter formulated as:

Consequentialism: The right action in circumstances C for agent S is that action which, out of all of the alternatives available to S in C, will produce the greatest net sum of intrinsic value in the long run. (124)

Jeske provides some familiar reasons for rejecting consequentialism, while also going to great lengths to emphasize that consequences matter and that her case studies illustrate how we can be better at taking them into account in our reasoning.

Chapter 5 is about the connection between moral reasoning and the emotions, with Ted Bundy as the main case study. Jeske seeks to articulate a moderate position which acknowledges that "emotions play important roles in our acquisition of moral knowledge and moral concepts and in the actions we take" (194), while denying that the emotions are all there is to making moral judgments. Rather, "intellectual deliberation requires emotion for its integration into agency, but only deliberation can guide that integration in an appropriate and meaningful way" (155).

Chapter 6, the last of the four on impediments to moral reasoning, is devoted to self-deception and moral evasion, with Jefferson, Stangl, Speer, and Jones all figuring prominently as case studies. Jeske focuses in particular on moral evasion, understood as one type of self-deception, which "allowed each man to maintain a self-schema that involved a conception of himself as a good man, or, at the least, to be able to continue doing his job without being disturbed by pesky pangs of conscience" (203). She then proceeds to use her case studies to distinguish between different forms of evasion: refusal to engage (Stangl), belief avoidance (Speer), and wishful compromise (Jones).

Chapter 7 concludes the book by coming full circle back to the case of Jefferson and slavery, and examining how all four impediments to moral reasoning were present in his own thinking. But Jeske also has the reader in mind, since "perhaps we can be more open to seeing the impediments that block our own paths" (225). In particular, she warns us that Jefferson's impediments pertained to slavery, but ours might pertain in similar ways to our treatment of non-human animals and to our ignoring the suffering of strangers in need.

Overall, I find Jeske's views to be eminently reasonable. I share her rejection of cultural relativism and of consequentialism, and appreciate her moderate position on the role of the emotions in moral psychology and her insights about different forms of moral evasion. My comments instead are concerned with three respects in which what is already a good book could have been even better in my opinion.

The Choice of Case Studies. While each is interesting in its own right, Jeske's six case studies collectively might have been supplemented, especially with students and non-academics in mind as the intended audience. They are all white men. The Nazis and slaveholders are both historically remote and can feel psychologically remote. Ted Bundy is not historically remote, but as a particularly extreme psychopath, he is arguably the most psychologically alien to us of the six.

The concern here is about relatability. We can barely relate to Bundy (or at least I hope we can't). But I imagine it is also hard for many readers to relate to the other five examples. Closely bound up with this is applicability. Students might read about a Nazi commandant of a concentration camp, and have a hard time translating that case to their own situation or taking seriously the idea that they might share some of the same evil tendencies within themselves as well. So I think Jeske would have been better served adding a few contemporary case studies of "ordinary" people from the news who find themselves in situations where, say, they could help someone in need or resist temptation to cheat, but they don't.

Engagement with the Empirical Literature. Jeske begins her book by sharing about some of her fears growing up when she learned about the Holocaust. In particular, by age fourteen, "instead of being afraid of being a victim, I had become afraid that I carried within me the potential to be a perpetrator" (ix). And a constant theme throughout the book is the potential danger of "evils within" which might become manifest in our behavior and against which moral philosophy can be helpful in working (31).

So it was surprising to not find Jeske appealing to the reams of experimental work from social psychology which could have strengthened her claim about the potential for "evils within." Consider her own fear about the potential for becoming a perpetrator of atrocities. As she writes:

We are forced to wonder whether the only thing that keeps us from the evil of genocide or slaveholding is the good fortune of being born into circumstances in which such policies and institutions are frowned upon and punished rather than encouraged or rewarded. How would each of us fare if we were tested by difficult moral choices (31)?

As a general matter we do not have to wonder about this (or at least not wonder very much). Stanley Milgram's obedience research is one reason why. Under pressure from an authority figure, the majority of participants in the most famous version of Milgram's studies were willing to turn an electric shock dial up to the XXX level and thereby kill an innocent person (or so it appeared to them). Similarly there is ample evidence for how people in general tend to address other "difficult moral choices" (for reviews, see Miller 2013, 2014). Research on the bystander effect or on academic cheating is relevant to the moral behavior side; research on heuristics and bias is relevant to the moral reasoning side.

This point ties in naturally to the first concern. For by drawing on this empirical research, Jeske could have made the lessons she wanted to draw from her case studies (apart from Bundy) more relatable and applicable. In light of the empirical evidence, it becomes much more plausible that we might share some of the same "evil within."

The Good Within. My third friendly suggestion would have been to devote some space to the good within as well. Just like her negative exemplars, Jeske could have had positive exemplars. Similar to how Jefferson and Speer serve as helpful illustrations for how not to engage in moral reasoning, Gandhi and Lincoln serve as helpful illustrations for how to engage in moral reasoning. They have the added advantage of playing an inspirational role, as we often admire their character and find ourselves being moved and elevated to become more like them.

Given the first point above, some of the case studies of good behavior could have been "ordinary" people doing things that were heroic or self-sacrificial. And given the second point above, appeal could have been made to findings in psychology to show that we also have such capacities for good within us. For instance, the psychologist Dan Batson's work on how empathy often increases helping behavior and does so for genuinely altruistic motivating reasons, would have been a natural source from which to draw (Batson 2011).

The above are intended as three friendly amendments that I might have suggested if I were a reviewer for the press. Let me end with an objection that I suspect many readers will raise and which I think it would have been wise for Jeske to have addressed preemptively. The subtitle of her book is "Why We Need Moral Philosophy." Jeske makes a number of claims on behalf of moral philosophy such as: "The reflective analytical stance inculcated by philosophical study is crucial for good moral agency . . . Moral deliberation of a philosophical nature cannot be avoided, and so we need to educate the young in at least the rudiments of moral philosophy" (155). What if it were to turn out, though, that professional moral philosophers do not show any signs of behaving any better than anyone else, and in particular when compared to professors in other fields? It seems like that could be a problem for Jeske's optimism about the impact of moral philosophy.

So far, the behavioral evidence with respect to moral philosophers is not encouraging, as we know thanks primarily to the studies conducted by Eric Schwitzgebel. He writes that,

Ethicists do not appear to behave better. Never once have we found ethicists as a whole behaving better than our comparison groups of other professors, by any of our main planned measures. But neither, overall, do they seem to behave worse. For the most part, ethicists behave no differently from professors of any other sort -- logicians, chemists, historians, foreign-language instructors (2015).

Supposing that this research holds up to future replication attempts, I am curious to see what Jeske would say about its implications for her project.

These few amendments and wishes are not meant to detract from this engaging and innovative book. I hope it succeeds in drawing many students and general readers into the important world of moral philosophy. And even more importantly, I hope it succeeds in helping to reduce the evil both within and without.


Batson, C. Daniel. (2011). Altruism in Humans. New York: Oxford University Press.

Miller, Christian. 2013. Moral Character: An Empirical Theory. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Miller, Christian. 2014. Character and Moral Psychology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schwitzgebel, Eric. 2015. "Cheeseburger Ethics." Aeon.