The Evolution of Darwinism

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Timothy Shanahan, The Evolution of Darwinism, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 352pp, $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 05211541980.
University of Iowa

Reviewed by David Depew, University of Iowa


The professed aim of Timothy Shanahan’s The Evolution of Darwinism is “to convey an understanding of the sort of evolution that forms the basis of contemporary Darwinism” by reviewing how “Darwinism itself has evolved” (7). The strategy is to set forth Darwin’s views on three central issues in evolutionary biology and to compare them with contemporary Darwinian thinking about the same issues.  Shanahan encapsulates the three issues as “selection, perfection, and direction” (3).  The first refers to the so-called “units of selection” controversy.  On what entities does natural selection act?  Genes?  Individuals? Groups? Species?  Under  “perfection,” Shanahan comprehends questions about just how adapted are the entities that natural selection brings forth.  Perfectly? Relatively? Barely?  Finally, “direction” raises the vexed issue of evolutionary progress.  Is evolution going somewhere? These issues are well chosen. They come up for discussion within professional evolutionary theory and related disciplinary communities, notably philosophy of biology – Shanahan’s own community – as well as in a public sphere that has always considered itself a stakeholder in controversies about biological origins, especially in America.

Shanahan does not explicitly identify his intended audience or audiences, so I have had to do a bit of guessing.  Professionals, whether they are evolutionary biologists or philosophers of evolutionary biology, are not likely to find much that is new about the current state of issues with which they are probably familiar.  But they may appreciate Shanahan’s careful and thorough review of Darwin’s views, as well as his assessments about who is right and wrong in contemporary disputes.  In the latter connection, Shanahan submits competing claims to teacherly clarifications of meaning, the validity or invalidity of the arguments in which these claims figure, and the acceptability of the premises that confer or fail to confer soundness on these arguments. Sometimes Shanahan finds well-known arguments, including some of those associated with the late Stephen Jay Gould (217-213), wanting in one or more of these basic epistemic virtues.  However, I think it is non-specialist readers who are most likely to find the book useful and rewarding, especially those readers -– teachers and students -- who find themselves in educational institutions, which perform a sort of mediating role between technical and public spheres of discussion.  One can sense beneath the polished surface of this well-written book many well-prepared, well-conducted, and well-assimilated classroom experiences, including, I would guess, with undergraduates. 

Two general implications of the inquiry seem to me especially useful for general readers.  First, many latter-day Darwinians who write for broad audiences, such as Richard Dawkins, Ernst Mayr, Daniel Dennett, or Gould, have a bad habit of subtly finding their own views in Darwin himself, if not ad litteram, then implicitly or prefiguratively.  Shanahan’s thoroughly researched reconstructions of Darwin’s sometimes conflicting, but always insightful opinions on “selection, perfection, and direction” go far to check this tendency.  This tendency also runs in the other direction.  Creationists have an equally bad habit of thinking they have refuted Darwinism when they have merely found inadequacies in earlier Darwinians or in Darwin himself.  Let me take an example that is not dealt with by Shanahan, but which is important in evolutionary controversies.  It is a defensible claim that Darwin and his immediate followers did not have much of a theory of speciation.  So failed or fraudulent quests for fossil intermediates between extant taxa are often presented by Darwinism’s enemies as scandals.  But it does not follow that the twentieth-century Darwinism of the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis does not have some really solid models of speciation and evidence for their operation in nature.  In short, Darwinism has evolved, as Shanahan’s title asserts, and continues to evolve.  It is, in terms I fancy but Shanahan may not, a fecund research tradition, which continues to bring forth from its core ideas well-articulated problem-solving research programs.  Unless and until the well runs dry, this fecundity will allow Darwinism to stay ahead of both alternative evolutionary traditions and anti-evolutionary currents of thought.  

I turn now to Shanahan’s views on his three topics.   First, “although Darwin preferred explanations in terms of selection operating on individual organisms, he was perfectly willing to entertain explanations in terms of selection at the level of groups when the situation warranted it” (32), such as in insect species with sterile castes.   This can be made consistent with Darwin’s basic individualism by treating such groups as individuals.  But Darwin himself was not much of a conceptual analyst, and so this solution was not fully worked out until contemporary philosophers of biology and philosophizing biologists began to engage in the admirable bout of cooperative conceptual clarification that forms the tacit background of this book.  (Shanahan does not make it clear enough that philosophers like himself, not biologists, have done much of the heavy lifting in clarifying and defending Darwinism in recent decades.)  For his part, Darwin’s characteristic frankness led him to acknowledge that his theory would be doomed if the principle that individual good must be secured before social good can be countenanced were to be falsified.  But Darwin’s followers did not worry enough about this problem.  So it is not odd that V. C. Wynne Edwards uncritically violated it when he argued in the l960s that birds regulate the number of their offspring “for the good of the species.”  The pummeling that Wynne Edwards endured at the hands of strict neo-Darwinians was the means by which new approaches that do not violate Darwin’s principle came to the fore.  One such idea is “kin-selection,” which heartened modern Darwinians by showing how cooperative behavior can arise without appealing to group selection at all.  Another, no less important impulse was to transform the notion of group selection itself into a family of ideas collectively called “interdemic group selection.”  Interdemic group selection has been empirically demonstrated in several cases, such as house mice.  Its occurrence would be even more widespread if the ecologist David Sloan Wilson’s notion of “trait groups” were accepted as a way of marking off the relevant groups.  For his part, however, Shanahan tends to throw cold water on this possibility by sympathizing with technical arguments that reduce trait-group selection to a form of frequency-dependent selection operating, at the end of the day, on individual organisms (61).  He is not dogmatic about this, saying that the issue is mostly semantic (61).  But for what it’s worth my view is that in Darwinism semantics is substance, and that on this point Darwinism still has some evolving to do. 

Shanahan also discusses the hypothesis that genes are the units of selection.  To deal with this claim, philosophers of biology have clarified the idea of “units of selection” by  distinguishing among interactors, replicators, and beneficiaries of selection. They have shown that “genes typically interact with their environment to influence their own survival only via adaptations associated with organismic phenotypes,” as Shanahan puts it.  So while genes are replicators, they are not interactors (except in a cellular context not explored in detail by Shanahan), and are only equivocally beneficiaries of selection: as parts of organisms, they are not; as genotypes preserved intact through multiple meiotic divisions they are.  Genic selectionism can then be rephrased as a claim that counting over genes (=genotypes) is the only way good way to represent the process of selection. Happily, Shanahan agrees with most other philosophers of biology that “there are many adequate representations of selection” (82).  This “pluralism” inclines Shanahan to a position in which there is a trade off between the predictive power of following genotypes and the causal processes that underlie this result, in which genes are one kind among many of what some call “developmental resources” in a deeply complex epigenetic process.  

This brings us to Shanahan’s second topic, adaptation and adaptationism.  Anyone who reads The Origin of Species will encounter Darwin’s upbeat, fervent, even theodicial conviction that “natural selection always selects for the good” of each individual, where good seems vaguely to mean more than mere reproductive success.  Darwin’s individualism is basic to this argument because natural selection “scrutinizes,” as Darwin puts it, even minute differences between individuals in order to bring forth adaptations that constantly refit organisms to changing environments with far greater precision than Paleyean creationism -- which has God fitting typologically defined species into stable niches -- ever could. (I might add that this was not a problem for Paleyean creationism until geology eroded the idea that environments are relatively constant.)  The implication is that Darwin thought that natural selection produces perfectly adapted organisms.  But Shanahan recognizes that Darwin’s position was actually more subtle than that.  First, while Darwin had toyed with perfect adaptation during his silent years, by the time he wrote Origin he had recognized that his theory implied only that “natural selection tends only to make each organic being as perfect as, or slightly more perfect than, the other inhabitants of the same country with which it has to struggle for existence” (Darwin l859, 472) (l04). This concession, Shanahan reports, grows stronger with each subsequent edition, and he concludes that for Darwin “the standard of superiority is a local one” (l04).  But Shanahan also points out in an interesting discussion that Darwin construes even relative adaptedness as driven by a force that tends by its very nature toward perfect adaptedness, even if it never quite makes it.  Second, in dealing with vestigial organisms and other such phenomena, Darwin conceded that not every trait in every organism is well adapted (just as he also conceded that not every well adapted trait is a product of natural selection: sexual-selection, Lamarckian, and other mechanisms also do some of the work).  Still, even in the case of vestigial organs, Darwin saves the day by thinking of traits that have been carried along by descent as having once been well adapted.  In this connection, Shanahan might have made more of the fact that, while Origin of Species is addressed to a general audience that can be presumed to be familiar with that text’s implied Paleyesque opponent, Darwin himself was far more preoccupied over a longer period of time with demonstrating to other professionals that he had a way of reconciling Cuvier’s functionalist view that the traits of each kind are adapted to its way of life with Geoffroy’s notion of “unity of type.”  For Darwin, functionalism is explained by natural selection and unity of type by descent from a common ancestor.  Nonetheless, Darwin holds that, even if one is more basic than the other, these remain two different principles, and so call forth different kinds of explanation. Seen in this light, Darwin’s doctrine about non-adaptive traits having once been adapted and then passed along the chain of descent would be even less amenable to an adaptationist spin than Shanahan suggests.  

Where does this discussion stand today?  This depends, Shanahan implies, on how you conceptually analyze the notions of “adaptation” and “adaptationism.” Some take adaptation to be a functional concept measured by experiments showing efficient, effective engineering design.  Others take it as an historical, or “etiological,” concept in which organisms are said to be (relatively) adapted just in case their ancestors had traits whose heritability explains why their descendents are still around.  It will be recognized that this dispute is a twist on the old argument between Cuvier and Geoffroy that Darwin took himself to have mediated. Those who prefer the first approach think of natural selection as design by other means, and are more likely to be adaptationists in one or another sense.  Their opponents think of evolution by natural selection not as an alternative means of design, but as an alternative to design altogether, and sometimes appeal to neo-Geoffroyean “constaints on form” to low-ball the degree and extent of adaptedness.

As Shanahan reports, philosophers of biology have tried to get some purchase on this testy issue by distinguishing between empirical, explanatory, and methodological forms of adaptationism. Empirical adaptationism holds that most, if not all, traits distributed to organisms are adaptations; explanatory adaptationism that, quite apart from how many traits are adaptations, it is natural selection that explains the traits that are.  Methodological adaptationism presumes that natural selection is the cause of adaptations until it finds out otherwise (l69).   It would seem that if the mature Darwin was an adaptationist – a term that did not get thrown around until later -- it was in the first sense; his concessions to other mechanisms rule out strict explanatory adaptationism, while the separability of selection from descent seems to me to make methological adaptation a risky gambit.  Shanahan’s own position seems to combine a preference for the engineering rather than the etiological sense of adaptation with approval of methodological adaptationism so long as biologists bring a certain scepticism to the scene of inquiry (l69). 

We now reach evolutionary progress, a topic that engages Shanahan’s passionate interest, and to which, I cannot help thinking, his other opinions are oriented.  He shows clearly that Darwin was a progressivist, where this means less than directed (by an agent, like God), but more than merely directional: progress requires not just cumulative change by some measure or other, but objective improvement (205).  Shanahan mentions that Darwin’s support for this idea draws on the notion that the living world is getting more and more differentiated, and hence specialized, in terms of occupied and occupiable niches (l8l-185).  But he does not mention that this view is conceptually built into an assumption that Darwin took from the study of ontogeny (and originally from French physiocrat economics) and applied to phylogeny.  Darwin’s most influential predecessors (Herbert Spencer) and disciples (Ernst Haeckel) ran amok with this notion.  Twentieth-century professional Darwinians have abandoned it completely, even though it remains stubbornly embedded in popular images of evolution.  Thus Shanahan discounts Gould’s attacks on progressivism as tilting against popular windmills of this provenance, and so as not valid at all against evolved Darwinism (213). Still, as Shanahan rightly points out, many sophisticated modern Darwinians have been objective progressivists, and on good grounds. 

Shanahan himself is enthusiastic about a criterion proposed by G. G. Simpson, according to which there has been an objective increase in adaptations that enable organisms to “survive and reproduce despite changing environmental conditions” (237).  Intelligence as a function of big brains would be such an adaptation.   In a lyrical moment, Shanahan is “tempted to agree” that a non-directed tendency toward intelligent control over the environment “would provide a basis for an optimistic interpretion of the cosmic drama,” and even for thinking about what sounds to me like a Teilhardian noosphere “already emerging in the bourgeoning World Wide Web” (280).  What takes some getting used to is that Shanahan takes the motor of such possible progressivism to be the “evolutionary arms races” out of which Dawkins has conjured up a darker vision.  Whatever else might be said for or against this idea, Shanahan puts himself in a position to consider it because of his preference for an engineering analysis of adaptation and methodological adaptationism. In part because I am not convinced on these philosophical points, I remain morosely inclined toward some of the counterarguments to progressivism that Shanahan dutifully, but unenthusiastically catalogues, such as the notion that humans are “the ultimate predators” (273), whose competitive edge over other species is likely to erode the conditions that make it possible.

I would use this book in some classes in preference to, or in conjunction with, philosophy of biology texts that are too technical, as well as in preference to tracts addressed to the general reader, such as those of Dawkins, which hide the philosophical problems that Shanahan raises.  At the same time, I would complement it with other texts suggesting that the Darwinian tradition has not been as continuously progressive as it can seem when one moves as quickly as Shanahan does from Darwinism Invented to Darwinism Evolved.  Darwinism has had an interesting history because there were moments when it failed, and when it saved itself by overhauling its conceptual framework, especially by taking advantage of the statistical revolution.  Finally, I would complement Shanahan’s book with texts that explore how well Darwinism is doing on substantive topics in evolutionary biology, such as speciation, development, ecological co-evolution, and classification.  A book that simply analyses the nature and implications of Darwinism’s central theoretical concepts cannot, by itself, count as a book about evolution.