The Evolution of Logic

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W. D. Hart, The Evolution of Logic, Cambridge University Press, 2010, xi + 299pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521747721.

Reviewed by Mary Tiles, University of Hawai'i at Mānoa


A better title for this book might have been A Chapter in the Evolution of Mathematical Logic, since it deals neither with the broad sweep of the history of logic nor even the many ways in which logic has been evolving or changing since the mid-twentieth century. Moreover, it restricts attention to mathematical logic, namely the mathematical study of mathematical deductive theories written in a formal language (mostly that of first-order predicate logic, although second-order languages and logic receive some mention). The book's primary function, as stated by the author in his preface, is very narrowly confined; it is to acquaint philosophers with the view, attributed to Fred Bernstein, that modern logic is distinguished by certain methods: "After Gödel's method of arithmetization, which was like basic literacy, these distinctive methods were constructible sets, forcing and generic sets, and the priority method." (p. x) To this list Hart adds Morley's theorem (see below). Chapters 6 through 9 are designed to present versions of "Fred's four monuments" to philosophers. Chapters 1 through 5 set the stage by discussing the co-evolution of set theory with mathematical logic and Gödel's two incompleteness theorems.

Philosophical questions not raised include what is meant by logic or a logical system (Gabbay 1994), the relation of logic to reasoning, whether there can be many logics or just one, and whether it can be fully formal in the precise mathematical sense of requiring an uninterpreted formal language with formal rules. Indeed, given the book's stated intention of trying to interest philosophers in some key methods of modern logic, there is remarkably little philosophical discussion. What there is pertains more to issues regarding the foundations of mathematics and the nature of mathematical objects (real and abstract in the author's opinion) than to logic per se. Another important, but omitted, topic would concern the relationship between mathematics and logic. One thing that this book is clearer about than some other presentations is the co-evolution of classical first-order predicate logic and the now standard set theories (Zermelo-Fraenkel, Gödel-Bernays). There is also an unusually clear explanation of Quine's contributions to set theory and how they differ from the now mainstream approach.

However, the bulk of the material of Chapters 1-5 has been presented many times in many formats -- ranging from Hofstadter (1979) through Crossley (1972) and Wolf (2005) to perhaps the most philosophically sophisticated while also rigorous treatment in Hallett (1984). Many of these accounts are more readily accessible and include more philosophical discussion about the import of these developments than is provided by Hart. So if there is something new it lies in Chapters 6 through 9.

But here again there are other, more perspicacious accounts of the use of constructible sets and of the techniques associated with forcing available elsewhere (Wolf (2005), Crossley (1972), and Fitting (1969), for example). Indeed there is no mention of the connections between forcing and the algebraic approach to logic including the methods of Boolean-valued models pioneered by Dana Scott (see Bell 1977). There is much that should interest philosophers in this area but it needs both more motivation and clearer presentation than we are offered here.

That leaves the priority method and Morley's theorem. Should these be of interest to philosophically minded logicians or to philosophers with an interest in logic? Both are certainly of interest to mathematicians concerned with infinite sets and with issues of computability. The priority method for constructing recursively enumerable sets was invented independently by Richard Freidberg and Albert Muchnik in the 1950s (an outline of the method can be found in the Wikipedia entry on Post's problem). The priority method is an important technique for establishing results about recursively enumerable sets and certainly those interested in computability and in computer implementations of reasoning might well want to be familiar with this area. The philosophical motivation offered by Hart is:

The accessible products of reason are reasoning as in arguments and explanations, and of those deductive theories are among the richest samples. So a critique of reason should include an examination of deductive theories. From a less empirical perspective one might hope to examine a structure into which all possible deductive theories fall. So a critique of pure reason should examine the structure of the r.e. [sc. recursively enumerable] degrees. (p. 234)

But does all deductive reasoning really occur in formal deductive theories? How does this work on deductive systems relate to decision problems and why should philosophers be interested in those? Chaitin (1998) or Grim (1998) might be more likely to get philosophers interested in this area.

Morley's (categoricity) theorem (1965) states that if a first order theory in a countable language is categorical in some uncountable cardinality, then it is categorical in all uncountable cardinalities. (Note that the author's statement of the theorem on p. 267 is somewhat imprecise.) One might wonder how a theorem qualifies as a method. On p. 238 Hart cites Wilfred Hodges' evaluation of Morley's theorem: "The statement of the theorem is no big deal; the value lies in two other things. There are, first, the techniques one develops in order to prove the theorem, and, second, the elegant structure theory which emerges from the proof." For philosophers of set theory and model theorists this is clearly of interest, but the broader philosophical payoff that Hart sees is that these methods, and the proofs in which they are used, invoke the existence of "rather striking objects" and "expand our zoology of reality" (p. 276). But does this really advance debate about the status of such objects or the knowledge gained by apparent reference to them? Hart clearly thinks it provides support for realism about the set theoretic universe as a foundation for the other abstract objects required by mathematics. However, I don't see the ability to describe and prove results about these items as any more compelling a case for realism than is watching someone draw pictures of the constructible universe of sets while giving a detailed description of it. Certainly an account of what is going on is required (as it would be for a description of Alice's Wonderland), but it isn't clear what metaphysical standing such descriptions confer.

One overall problem with Hart's presentation is that the proofs and formal work are all laid out in prose style, with little use of subheadings and no flagging or offsetting of definitions for technical terms or of theorems. This, coupled with a habit of making occasional abrupt topic transitions from one paragraph to the next, makes it difficult to follow for those accustomed to a more mathematical layout. Another is that the style of exposition is very uneven; some relatively elementary points are belabored (for example, the discussion of analyticity in chapter two, which sits in an oddly disconnected way between two chapters on naïve set theory and responses to the set theoretic paradoxes), whereas more technical points are introduced with little preparatory explanation -- for example, the terms "n.e." and "n.r." which first appear in the diagram on p. 126 and are afterwards explained as abbreviations for "numerically expressible" and "numerically representable" respectively, with these terms, in turn, subsequently defined but not motivated. Instead we are told "It will turn out that all decidable relations on numbers are n.e. in S, but it will take us a while to explain what it is for a relation to be decidable." (p.128) "Decidable" is not indexed so one cannot hop forward to get the explanation.

So all in all I cannot recommend this book in spite of its promising title.


Bell, J.L. (1977) Boolean-valued Model and Independence Proofs in Set Theory, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Chaitin, Gregory J. (1998) The Limits of Mathematics, Springer-Verlag.

Crossley, J.N. et al. (1972) What is Mathematical Logic? Oxford: Oxford University Press. Reprinted New York: Dover 1990.

Fitting, M.C. (1969) Intuitionist Logic, Model Theory and Forcing, Amsterdam-London: North Holland Publishing Company.

Gabbay, Dov M. (1994) What is a Logical System? Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Grim, Patrick et al. (1998) The Philosophical Computer: Exploratory Essays in Philosophical Computer Modelling, Cambridge, MA and London, UK: The MIT Press.

Hallett, Michael (1984) Cantorian Set Theory and Limitation of Size, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Hofstadter, Douglas R. (1979) Gödel, Escher, Bach: an Eternal Golden Braid, New York: Basic Books.

Wolf, Robert S. (2005) A Tour through Mathematical Logic, The Carus Mathematical Monographs Number 30, The Mathematical Association of America.