The Evolution of Modern Metaphysics: Making Sense of Things

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A.W. Moore, The Evolution of Modern Metaphysics: Making Sense of Things, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 668pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521851114.

Reviewed by Lee Braver, Hiram College


"Ambitious" is a word that crosses one's mind as one reads A.W. Moore's The Evolution of Modern Metaphysics: Making Sense of Things. To be honest, the word arises in simply hefting the 668 page work; the book's project makes the word unavoidable. Cambridge's series, Evolution of Modern Philosophy, assigns its texts to "chart the evolution of some branch of philosophy from the beginning of the modern era to the present" (xviii), with Moore's branch being metaphysics. Outlined so broadly, the project is dauntingly difficult -- to tell the tale of modern metaphysics from inception to the present, from soup to nuts, ontologically speaking. Moore structures his narrative around individual figures: each of his 21 chapters lays out a particular philosopher's metaphysical views and arguments, traveling the long distance from Descartes to Deleuze. These chapters are grouped in three parts: "The Early Modern Period," "The Analytic Tradition," and "Non-Analytic Traditions." The Table of Contents alone indicates the breadth necessary to pull off such a feat -- one needs a strong grasp of 21 very different thinkers ranging across four centuries and three semi-separate branches or eras. Hence, "ambitious."

Does Moore pull it off? By and large, yes; pretty well in fact. And here the key word changes from "ambitious" to "impressive." Moore has read and absorbed a tremendous amount of material, both primary and secondary (the bibliography alone runs to forty-three pages). Although he has certainly specialized in some of his research, he also seems to have never stopped being a student, in the very best sense. Whereas most of us lay down the burden of reading widely in order to read deeply once we pass our prelims, gaining a greater knowledge of a few trees in lieu of the forest, Moore never stopped reading a wide diversity of figures. Indeed, he laments contemporary philosophy's hyper-specialization, making a plea for and contribution to works that try to capture the big picture (xix). He is skilled at explaining ideas and arguments, as well as in bringing them into contact with each other. His work evinces the highest qualities of a historian of philosophy (a label he happily applies to himself, distinguishing it from historians of ideas who give a primarily historical rather than a philosophical account): sympathy balanced with the willingness to criticize when called for, governed by an overall sense of fairness.

Now any list of this kind, like Rolling Stone's lists of Greatest Guitarists of All Time, inevitably leads to quibbles (George Harrison ranked above Stevie Ray Vaughan? Come on!). Here, I hesitated over the inclusion of Bergson and Collingwood, as well as the absence of Putnam, Foucault, Sartre, and Kierkegaard (although not known as a metaphysician, Kierkegaard was a first-rate meta-metaphysician who eloquently spoke to some of Moore's concluding remarks about the nature of metaphysics (603)). Such cavils are nearly inevitable and overall this is a very respectable list with conscientious and dependable interpretations; one can recommend the volume to students, for example, worry-free. Indeed, Moore himself tells the reader at the outset, "I shall do little to challenge the canon. And I shall do little to challenge a relatively orthodox interpretation of each of my protagonists" (xviii). And this is borne out: his readings tend to be fairly standard; respectable and reliable, if not rich in innovative insights or original readings. This is not meant as a criticism -- innovative reading isn't what Moore set out to do, although he has strong praise for those who do so, especially Deleuze (599; strangely, given his interest in the practice, Moore doesn't say much about Heidegger's "violent" readings of canonical figures).

This does end up being something of a weakness, however, as I asked myself who the book's intended audience would be. Who would read it with interest and benefit? It is unlikely to be assigned for a course -- it's hard to imagine any class covering more than a fraction of the book's contents. There can't be many people with as strong a grasp of all of these figures as Moore, so most could gain from reading at least a few of the chapters, though much of it will be, by Moore's own admission, rather standard fare. There is little in the Early Modern part, for example, that one wouldn't glean from a good undergraduate survey. Once again, I don't mean this to be a criticism -- Moore concedes as much; I'm just trying to take the measure of the book. One audience that could benefit enormously from it would be graduate students. I can easily see this becoming a standard text for those preparing for an M & E preliminary exam, and it would perform this task very well. I must add, however, that I was particularly looking forward to the chapter on Deleuze, given Moore's enthusiasm for him and my own ignorance of his work, but I came away from the chapter without feeling that I had acquired a foothold in that forbidding philosophical territory.

Where Moore does promise "a distinctive contribution" is in "the connections and patterns that I discern" (xviii), so let us turn to those. First, he offers a useful definition of metaphysics broad enough to cover figures of very diverse intent without losing all content. He defines it, in the first sentence of the book, as "the most general attempt to make sense of things" (1). This definition allows him great latitude in treating various ways of making sense, various kinds of sense and of things to be made sense of, and various verdicts on whether such an attempt can be successful (the answer to which itself becomes part of making sense of things). Related to this last issue, Moore folds into the attempt to make sense a reflectiveness or self-consciousness about the attempt itself. Part of making sense of things is making sense of this very attempt; whether success is possible or not may tell us a great deal about the sense of things. This qualification does mean that epistemological issues are essential to metaphysics so defined, further expanding the subject matter of the book, albeit organically.

Finally, Moore deploys three questions to guide his inquiries: The Transcendence Question concerning the boundary of experience and our ability to speak intelligibly of what may lie beyond it; The Novelty Question concerning whether metaphysics can legitimately create new concepts, and whether it should; and The Creativity Question concerning whether we discover sense or more literally make it. These are meant to function as matrices by which we can plot various thinkers in terms of their combined answers (16). However, the role they actually play in the book turns out to be rather different, and far less prominent. Sometimes they help frame an individual figure's thought, but at other points they simply get tacked onto chapters that otherwise lack any discussion of them. Moore briefly covers all three in a footnote appended to the very end of the Frege chapter, for example. Near the end of the chapter on Dummett, Moore addresses Dummett's answer to Transcendence in a couple of sentences in a footnote, and says that his response to "the Creativity Question is less straightforward. It raises many further fascinating issues which I shall not pursue here" (367, n. 61). Well, why not? If these questions are to be organizing devices, and here one of them turns up "fascinating issues," why not pursue them, at least a little? It is moments like these that made me wonder just what work these questions are doing.

This raises the larger question of the overall purpose of the book. On the one hand, it is to serve as an omnibus tour of modern metaphysics, making stops at all appointed landmarks with maps to guide our understanding of each. On the other hand, it wants to impose an intelligible structure onto the group, making them into an evolution rather than a mere sequence, and drawing lessons from the overall pattern. Now these purposes are not contradictory but, especially with such a large number of figures, they do tend to tug in different directions -- the former towards inclusiveness, the latter towards selectivity. Do you want to cover every major metaphysician, or only those who progress the chosen narrative? Do you discuss the thinkers in terms that make best sense of their own system, or of the way they develop ideas from their predecessors and leave problems for their descendants? When it works, these two approaches complement each other, but it doesn't always work, leaving more than one figure awkwardly sticking out of the story a bit, a metaphysical dodo bird in the evolutionary tale.

One place this twofold strategy complicates matters is in the inclusion of both analytic and continental traditions. Moore prefers the term "non-analytic" to "continental" (xix-xx, 21-22), though I don't see why his name is better. Many criticize the term "continental" both because it makes a mismatched pair with analytic -- the former being geographical, the latter methodological -- and because it is geographically inaccurate -- both Frege and logical positivism originate from continental Europe, for example. I must confess, I've never seen the significance of these criticisms. "Continental" is the word that has become a name for a fairly loose group of philosophers who overlap in significant ways and who are in overlapping conversation with each other, while "analytic" does the same for a different, fairly distinct group. There are border-line cases, instances of dialogue between the groups (though very few that evince good will and understanding), and lots of differences amongst members of each, certainly, but that hardly undermines the division. The fact that the words that have come to be their names are, when taken literally, problematic, is irrelevant; they're names rather than descriptions at this point, like calling a grouping of digital bits on one's computer an "album," or the Utah Jazz retaining their name after leaving the far more logical home city of New Orleans. Defining one as simply the negation or shadow of the other, as Moore does, is hardly an improvement.

In any case, Moore's respect for and grasp of both traditions is one of the great strengths of the book. He rails against "the arrogance that casts [non-analytic philosophers] in the role of charlatans" (xx) and would consider it justification enough to publish his book "if it made a significant contribution to overcoming the absurd divisions" (xix). Hear, hear. Speaking for myself, it is positively thrilling to see someone engage in serious philosophical dialogue with thinkers from both traditions and bring them into conversation with each other, especially with such dexterity. The ease with which Frege and Hegel's views of logic are compared (214-216), or Nietzsche's proclamation of the death of God gets explained as an example of Carnap's external questions between linguistic frameworks (387-388), or Derrida's rejection of Platonic sense is compared to Quine's rejection of Fregean sense (523, n. 33), or Deleuze's understanding of sense with that of Frege and Wittgenstein (565-566), or the large scale comparison of the revival of metaphysics in the wake of Quine's adaptation of logical posivitism's empiricism with the rise of German Idealism after Kant adapted Hume's empiricism (330-331) -- well, these are just wonderful to see. It takes a bit of ground-laying, but once that work is done there is so much to learn from this kind of cross-fertilization. Books like this are de facto proof that philosophers working in these disparate traditions are doing the same kind of thing and can talk with each other in ways that mutually illuminate their work.

I was slightly disappointed, in fact, that Moore didn't bring this benefit out explicitly as one of the morals of the story at the book's end. The reason to study the history of philosophy is not to mine it for anticipations of contemporary views -- why go to all that trouble just to hear the same views populating journals today in somewhat archaic vocabulary? Rather, the value (or, rather, one value) lies in discovering positions and arguments that are absent from contemporary discussions, alternatives that our presuppositions have blinded us to (587). To do what I just said has little merit, one can recognize this as Gadamer's argument (and, before him, one of Heidegger's arguments) for studying the history of philosophy. But this applies to any tradition suitably distinct from one's own: engaging with any thinkers who do not rely on the same tacit assumptions that filter out ideas brings these assumptions to light, allowing one to see and therefore challenge them, whereas conversing with those who share them leaves them untroubled. Such divergence can be found in thinkers at a historical distance, but also to those working in communities separated from each other, as in the analytic-continental divide. As I have argued elsewhere, this divergence offers a tremendous hermeneutic yield if the branches are brought into dialogue in just the way Moore discusses the history of philosophy. Finches whose evolution branched off due to geographical isolation can, when brought together, create stronger genes. Mentioning this benefit might have aided Moore in his goal of overcoming the separation.

More than just blandly praising non-analytic (to use his term) thought, Moore goes into some detail about the difference and what in particular non-analytic philosophy has to offer. He sees analytic philosophy as following out the consequences of Frege's making "linguistic sense an object of philosophical scrutiny" whereas, to some degree under Nietzsche's influence, non-analytic philosophy treats sense in a much broader sense (371, see also 196-199). While Moore proclaims himself an analytic philosopher, his sympathies in this case lie with the other side due to his interest in the idea of a non-propositional sense which can be at least partially communicated via propositions, a position he finds in early Wittgenstein, but also in Heidegger, Derrida, and transcendental idealism in general (583-584, 589-590). He also scolds much of analytic thought for lacking "a distinctive kind of self-consciousness" enjoyed by the other two periods, early modern and non-analytic (342). And he praises non-analytic philosophers for being more open to conceptual innovation, for embracing the positive answer to the Novelty Question (368). A high regard for conceptual innovation is, in a sense, built into the very project of the book: tracing evolution tends to focus one's attention on mutations (599-600).

I have followed my general praise of the project as a whole with a number of specific complaints, so let me single out a few points for particular praise. Moore makes a helpful distinction between thin and thick sense-making, where the former allows formal allusions to entities without presupposing a substantive grasp of them while the latter means a reference to something one understands. This distinction allows Kant to avoid a version of Berkeley's master argument, repeated by Fichte, Hegel, and the early Wittgenstein, that because we absolutely cannot think what we can't think, we cannot even entertain or posit the existence of noumena. On Moore's reconstruction, we can make thin sense of the existence of things of which we cannot make thick sense (135-140). I'm not sure this gets us off the noumenal hook entirely, but I found it a very helpful illumination of this very slippery problem. Moore offers a particularly elegant, even eloquent discussion of Leibniz's two principles (67-69). He also gives an innovative reading of the Tractatus that tries to combine the traditional reading of it with the resolute reading associated with, among others, Cora Diamond and James Conant (238-248).

This leads me to a final point concerning Wittgenstein. Along with Deleuze, Wittgenstein is the closest the narrative comes to having a hero. Indeed, I would almost be tempted to append a sub-sub-title to the book: The Evolution of Modern Metaphysics: Making Sense of Things, with Constant Reference to Wittgenstein. Moore calls him a "touchstone" to whom he relates as many of the other figures as possible (589). This is due to the fact that he agrees most with the later Wittgenstein, albeit with a dash of the early notion of pseudo-expressions communicating valuable non-propositional insights thrown in (267, 589-590). As a great fan of Wittgenstein, I found these regular updates on his verdicts on various figures quite interesting and enjoyable.

On the whole, The Evolution of Modern Metaphysics represents an extremely impressive achievement. It largely succeeds at a dauntingly difficult task, and should become one of the go-to books for graduate students preparing for prelims. It can also serve as a useful reference work one can dip into for refreshers or guidance into unexplored territory. Finally, it stands as indisputable evidence that the barriers separating contemporary philosophers only do so with our support.