The Evolution of Moral Progress: A Biocultural Theory

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Allen Buchanan and Russell Powell, The Evolution of Moral Progress: A Biocultural Theory, Oxford University Press, 2018, 422pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190868413.

Reviewed by Allan Gibbard, University of Michigan (Emeritus)


This is a marvelous book. General progress over recent centuries has been vast -- that seems undeniable, even if there always remain horrendous dangers. Steven Pinker's 2018 book Enlightenment Now is one book that delineates the progress we have made from the Enlightenment of the late 17th century on; much of what he says we should all have broadly realized since mid-childhood, though not of course with the thoroughness and evidence that Pinker adduces. The vast proportion of people who were desperately poor has been vastly reduced, and even the 20th century horrors of war and genocide brought fewer deaths per capita to the world than there were in previous centuries.

All this constitutes improvement as assessed from a moral standpoint. But saying this leaves open whether some of this counts as moral progress strictly understood, improvement over time in prevailing morality and its hold on us. Specifically moral improvement, though, seems also undeniable. The abolition of slavery succeeded for the most part; the mid-20th century totalitarianisms of Hitler, Japanese militarists, Stalin, and Mao were defeated or reformed away. Claims of universal human rights have since then come to be widely embraced, and in substantial parts of the world, the welfare of non-human animals now counts in policies and in moral opinion. Alarmingly, we now have fresh grounds to worry, and Allen Buchanan and Russell Powell are cautious in what they officially claim for net moral advancement in our era. Indeed they deny that we could now formulate just what moral progress would consist in. But they don't leave it a mystery what they broadly think about its recent direction -- and on this, I think, they are clearly right: since the onset of the Enlightenment, moral progress has been substantial.

The aim of their book, however, is not chiefly to make the case for such an assessment. Rather, it is to present a "biocultural" explanation of patterns of moral progress -- and of moral regress too. The book focuses chiefly on one aspect of moral progress, namely moral inclusiveness, expanding the class of beings who are recognized as requiring moral consideration. Even for moral inclusiveness, Buchanan and Powell stress, there's no uniform tendency toward progress. They call moral inclusiveness a "luxury good": it is "only likely to be widespread and stable in highly favorable conditions". This strikes me as a strange term for the point they intend, but the point is probably right. They don't mean that moral inclusivity is something we could forgo without serious impact on human flourishing -- as getting the snazzy car one longs for may turn out not to be the key to happiness that some of us materialists crave. The point is rather just what they say: in the explanation I quoted, we go for it only under favorable conditions. In the harsh conditions that our genes have for the most part been selected to cope with -- in the "environment of evolutionary adaptation" -- prevailing morality is mostly exclusive. Outsiders will not be recognized as worthy of moral consideration. Milder conditions, though, they propose, have arisen from time to time, and under such conditions inclusiveness tends to expand. We are adapted to cope with harsh conditions, but also to take advantage of favorable conditions when they arise. We may thus be prone to inclusiveness under some kinds of milder conditions. The upshot is inclusivity as an adaptively plastic trait: there could be a kind of toggle switched by harsh conditions to a setting "be exclusive" and by mild conditions to a setting "be inclusive". As they put it, "Exclusivist moral response is a conditionally expressed trait that develops only when cues that were in the past reliably correlated with outgroup predation, exploitation, competition for resources, and disease transmission are detected."

Evolving this toggle needed from time to time both exclusivist-friendly and inclusivist-friendly ecological regimes. This hypothesis concerns the evolution of genetic propensities and selection pressures that bear on them. There has been evolutionary time for genetic propensities to be shaped by the possibilities of inclusivity, along with its dangers, since such things as trade, mating across groups, and alliances in war have existed for a long time. This genetic evolution would be Darwinian, but emphatically not in any sense that implies rigidity, and not in ways the social Darwinists envisioned. I myself have argued that the upshot of genetic evolution can be far more refined and morality-friendly than people often suppose.

The other kind of evolution the book treats is cultural. Cultural evolution and genetic evolution have quite different relations to the genes and the propensities they encode. Buchanan and Powell call the story it aspires to "evocultural", and a legitimate evocultural account will involve reproduction of both kinds. Genetic reproduction is a matter of how, in an environment, genes have acted to promote their own proliferation in later generations. Hume stressed that an explanation of what we are like must start with our native propensities, and our native propensities are to a great degree set by our genes. Central are our propensities to develop in differing ways in response to culture. Above all, human beings are genetically adapted to respond to cues about the kind of culture we have been born into -- and this has strongly shaped the native propensities of the human zygote. Among proto-humans, after all, what promoted genetic reproduction depended very much on features of the culture one was immersed in.

As for cultural evolution, Ruth Millikan has pioneered an account of "reproductive families" that includes reproduction of both sorts: families such as biological species that form via genetic reproduction, and cultural features such as words, syntax, songs, and styles that reproduce culturally -- via humans' genetic propensities to respond to, copy, and modify cultural features, which trace back ultimately to genetically shaped propensities to respond to cultural cues. This gives rise to a jumble of layers of propensities, as native propensities of the zygote or infant join cultural cues and other cues as to one's environment to give rise to new propensities -- which in turn join cultural and other environmental cues to give rise to further propensities, and so forth.

What I have been saying leaves the set of questions Buchanan and Powell aim their sights on: once we allow legitimate moral judgments to enter the story of progress along with what's strictly scientific and biological, how do any expectable patterns of improvement or regress in morality emerge? As I say, the book mainly confines its explanations to one aspect of moral progress, namely moral inclusivity as opposed to exclusivity. It takes it that -- for the most part, though perhaps not invariably -- inclusivity is morally better. It is an improvement in our morality to expand moral concern to a more inclusive range of people. The book then advances its thesis as to what chief tendencies one should expect in prevailing morality, that as conditions get less harsh, prevailing morality tends toward inclusivity, whereas when conditions get harsher, prevailing morality tends toward exclusivity. (They make an important qualification: what matters for this is how harsh things are perceived as being, so that demagogues can foster moral exclusivity by persuading us that things are harsh.) I find this thesis highly plausible. What's to be expected, then, is not a tendency always toward greater and greater moral inclusivity, but tendencies to progress in some periods and regress in others.

That brings us to "the inclusiveness anomaly", as the book calls it: Parts of contemporary morality, the book worries, are much more inclusive than one would expect -- at least if extant selectionist accounts were the whole story. Inclusivist morality is not rare, and this cannot, it argues, be explained by received, biologically grounded accounts of cultural change. Buchanan and Powell give cutesy titles to accounts they find inadequate: "Morality is not like a Moth's Proboscis" (158); that is, it is not evolved "in order to solve a social coordination problem, just as a pollenating moth's proboscis was 'engineered' by natural selection to solve a flower nectar extraction problem" (ibid.). It is not like a peacock's tail or a hyena's clitoris (164) -- phrases they also explain. And so on. A particularly powerful theory they reject as incomplete is that of Joseph Henrich and others, that much cultural change results from a tendency to copy, in some ways indiscriminately, those who show evident signs of success (as a Ph.D. student may copy the mannerisms of her advisor). The refutations they offer for items in their long list seem convincing. Still, morality doesn't arise by magic. It has to be in some way a biocultural phenomenon. What other kind of explanation does all this leave?

I'm not sure I fully understand their answer, but a chief term they use for what's missing is "open-ended normativity". They explain this as "the ability, in certain environments, to identify, scrutinize, and modify the norms we are following and the concepts we are employing and to become effectively motivated to realize these alterations in our behavior" (377). A part of their complaint about received evolution-infused accounts is that none of them accords any substantial causal role to normative judgments. It is disputed, to be sure, whether normative judgments play an important role of their own in social change, rather than being merely an upshot of other things, as Henrich and others argue. I am pretty much convinced by the book's extended line of argument that they do, an argument that draws on historical accounts of developments such as the abolition of slavery and the rise of an ethos of human rights. "Open-ended normativity" as an explanation of what's missing seems, though, to go beyond just saying that normative judgments have important effects on societal development -- that, in Marxist terms, they aren't just superstructure. What more does it involve? Is there a naturalistic, evocultural account to be had of the kind of "open-ended normativity" that might figure in social change? It involves, they have told us, identifying, scrutinizing and modifying norms and concepts that figure in motivating us. But there are various ways our concepts and norms might conceivably be modified, and some of these would make things worse. Just how will norms and concepts change when they are identified and scrutinized? They present historical examples: With abolitionism, reflection on what it was like for slaves played a crucial causal role. The human rights movement transformed "the idea of constitutionalism as limited to one country". What, then, is the right causal story of such changes, and how does it tie in with genetic and cultural evolution? A full answer to these questions is doubtless beyond anyone's powers, but an evocultural theory, I agree, is what we should be seeking, and perhaps we can begin to sketch answers to these questions.

What might be the causal mechanism that results in greater inclusivity in good times and less in bad times? How do genetic and cultural evolution figure in the answer? Why will social organisms whose genes evolved to proliferate in varying ancestral cultures interact in ways that eventuate in these patterns? I think their answer is at least roughly this: Good times allow gains from peace and cooperation across group boundaries, and so genes that eventuate in propensities to realize such gains tend then to proliferate. Over hundreds of millenia, this will involve changing one's gene-based propensities to respond morally to cues that times have gotten better, to scrutinize and modify one's norms in the direction of inclusiveness. People can then "extend their understanding of their moral identity to encompass moral obligations of ideals that are independent of compliance with norms of social morality." They "can develop conceptions of individual excellence and of personal moral commitments that are not only distinct from but in some cases even in tension with the reasonable demands of social morality." They can contribute to a "practice of interpersonal accountability for reasons."

Genetic and cultural evolution must figure in a good evocultural theory in a way somewhat like the following: Begin with Hume's thesis that any full account of what we are like and why must start with native human propensities. These propensities, we can say, have been shaped to foster the reproduction of one's genes in a range of ancestral conditions, genetically adapting us for living in culture. How, then, do upshots of genetic selection-pressures for living amidst cultural practices interact with cultural cues to produce patterns of cultural evolution? Criticism of norms can play a social role, as Buchanan and Powell argue, but we need an account of how such criticism works. In a substantial range of cultural surroundings, people have seeming insights that they find convincing and voice them; think of the moral preachings of Jesus as they are depicted, or the Buddha, or Confucians, or Muhammad. What causes one thought to seem plausible and another to be dismissed? When will people be convinced and motivated by moral thoughts that occur to them, and when not? When will others be convinced and perhaps add their own thoughts to what they hear? What, in the most utopian terms, is the function from our genetic adaptations for living amidst culture and the environments created by our interactions to the convictions that figure in the development of a society? Answering such questions probably exceeds all reasonable ambition -- but in the absence of magic, some such account must be right, whether or not we can achieve it. We need explanations of the power of moral reflection and the directions it takes.

We can see, to some degree, how reciprocity and cooperation lead to norms, including moral norms. Rawls stresses reciprocity in cooperative schemes for mutual advantage and norms that settle the terms of trade. (I adopted such a picture in my 1990 book Wise Choices, Apt Feelings.) The book calls such moral norms strategic, and tendencies toward them may be explained by the kinds of conventions that Thomas Schelling and David Lewis explain, with advantage understood as reproduction of the genes. How, causally, though, do we come to the conviction that we owe humaneness to dumb animals, unspoiled resources to future generations, and accommodations to the handicapped? How do we come to take ourselves to have duties to those who aren't contributing to the cooperative schemes we benefit from? That is a central puzzle the book addresses.

A substantial component of the explanation must be the strength of "How would you feel if it were done to you?" The whole relevant truth on this score would tell us how we might have evolved with the propensities we have to be moved by such questions in certain conditions. And a causal account along these lines, if we could have it, might indicate how moral reflection leads to things that constitute moral progress.

Their aim, Buchanan and Powell explain, is to reconcile evolutionary accounts with the greatest achievements up to now of prevailing morality, with the "hope that, with a full-fledged biocultural theory of moral progress one day in hand, human beings will be able to ensure that the arc of the moral universe continues to bend steadily, if not inexorably, toward progress" (395). They are, they say, attempting first steps, and their book ends with an appendix on topics for future research. "We have argued that the capacity for open-ended normativity plays an important role in moral progress, but it is not obvious how this fact could be accommodated within a framework that is properly called evolutionary" (410). I too don't find this obvious, but Buchanan and Powell give substantial indications how a biocultural theory of moral progress could work. Some development of the sorts of things they propose, I am convinced, must be right, and none of my worries about how to develop their proposals further lessen to any substantial degree my enthusiasm for their book. What they and I see as needing to be done would be difficult in the extreme, and this book is remarkable in bringing us -- as I hope -- closer to a point where we can sketch and begin to confirm the kind of account they seek.