The Evolution of Morality

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Richard Joyce, The Evolution of Morality, MIT Press, 2006, 288pp, $32.00, ISBN 0262101122.

Reviewed by Peter Singer, Princeton University and the University of Melbourne


Is morality innate? If it is, what difference does that make? A reader wishing to become clearer about these questions would be hard-pressed to find a better place to begin than Richard Joyce's The Evolution of Morality. In a text that, exclusive of notes and bibliography, runs to only 230 pages, he has managed to pack a remarkable amount of information, clarification, common sense, and thoughtful reflection. As the topic requires, Joyce draws on a wide range of research in animal behavior, anthropology, game theory, psychology, and neurophysiology, and he presents it all in a readable style with the occasional witticism thrown in.

After an introduction that seeks to dispel the fears that are commonly aroused by the claim that any psychological characteristics are "innate," Joyce spends the first four of the book's six chapters investigating whether morality is innate. He begins by setting out possible mechanisms by which, in the course of natural selection, organisms who help others of their kind might be favored. But Joyce does not think that helping behavior is equivalent to having a morality, so he then sets out what he regards as essential components of morality. Morality, as Joyce sees it, has a distinctive content, concerning interpersonal relationships. It is associated with emotions such as guilt, or having a "moral conscience." Joyce rejects non-cognitivism, holding that while moral judgments express attitudes, they are also assertions. Morality has what Joyce calls "practical clout" -- a combination of authority and inescapability. No one can opt out of it, or shrug it off. Joyce does not, however, insist that nothing can be a moral judgment unless it includes all of these elements, for he recognizes a degree of indeterminacy in our conception of morality.

Conspicuously absent from this list is universalizability. Although Joyce sees morality as inherently combating excessive individualism and he also thinks that to make a moral judgment is to subscribe to a standard, he rejects R.M. Hare's view that for a judgment to qualify as a moral judgment, it must be possible to phrase it in universal terms, avoiding proper names and personal pronouns. Joyce says that many communities have value systems that we don't hesitate to call "moral" even though they allow for particular judgments. He offers as an example a tribe that considers it permissible to kill foreigners, defining "foreigner" as "anyone who is not descended from the blood of Periboriwa." But it is hard to know what to make of this example. What do the tribal elders say when we ask them why those who are descended from the blood of Periboriwa are thus privileged? If they say that it is because this is their own blood group, we can ask if they believe that anyone may kill anyone else who is not a member of his or her own blood group -- in other words, do they think it morally permissible for people descended from different ancestors to kill them? If they agree that such killing would be morally permissible, their judgment is universalizable. If they disagree, they may still be making a universalizable judgment. They may, for instance, say that those descended from the blood of Periboriwa are not to be killed because they are divine, or because they are supremely wise. But if they feel no impetus to offer any such justification then it surely does become doubtful whether the judgment is a moral one.

Perhaps Joyce's rejection of universalizability is tied up with his concern to make his concept of morality as broad as possible, so that all, or virtually all, human societies have a morality. Conversely, however, he wishes to restrict morality to language users, and the means he uses to do this poses a problem for his denial of universalizability. Several observers have suggested something very like morality among chimpanzees. Although Joyce draws on Frans de Waal's reports of what might be seen as chimpanzee morality, he does not mention my favorite example from that observer's work. De Waal reports that after one chimp, Puist, had supported another, Luit, in fending off an attack from a third, Nikkie, Nikkie subsequently attacked Puist. Puist beckoned to Luit for support, but Luit did nothing. When the attack from Nikkie was over, Puist furiously attacked Luit. De Waal comments: "If her fury was in fact the result of Luit's failure to help her after she had helped him, this would suggest that reciprocity among chimpanzees is governed by the same sense of moral rightness and justice as it is among humans."1 Joyce would disagree, for he thinks that "… one cannot be counted competent with moral language unless one knows that in using it (seriously) one expresses subscription to certain practical standards."(p.84) Hence, he concludes, "no moral judgments for chimps." It is, of course, possible to raise the bar high enough so that nothing a chimpanzee does will count as evidence of the chimp having a moral sense, let alone making a moral judgment. But the notion of using a standard to judge a particular case does seem to bring with it something very like the idea of universalizability.

Whether or not we count chimpanzees among beings with a moral sense, there is no doubt that the acquisition of a sophisticated language transforms the nature of moral judgment and allows for the explicit invocation of moral standards. Joyce, drawing on Robin Dunbar's Grooming, Gossip and the Evolution of Language,2 suggests that our language was evaluative from the start. As the size of human society grew, it became important to know who would make a trustworthy reciprocator and who would not. Moralizing gossip provided that information.

Moral judgment may also have evolved, Joyce argues, because it provides a motivation in circumstances when prudential judgment may falter. Someone who feels guilt when she lets down a friend, for example, may be a more reliable reciprocator than someone who lacks this emotion. And being known to be a reliable reciprocator may be in her long-term interests. But how could natural selection have got us from mere aversions and inclinations about certain kinds of behavior to the more distinctively moral ideas of obligations, fairness, desert, and of something that is praiseworthy, or demanded, or unacceptable or contemptible? Hume pointed to our mind's "great propensity to spread itself on objects" and to raise "a new creation" that is in fact a projection of our own internal sentiment. Joyce gives this an evolutionary twist, suggesting that natural selection favored this particular kind of delusion: those who project their emotions on the world then perceive morality as something external to them, something that possesses an authority that comes from beyond themselves, and demands obedience from them. That is how morality gets its "practical clout." Moreover, although the content of each individual's moral judgments is obviously heavily influenced by the culture in which he or she develops, the tendency to make moral judgments, and to see morality as being out there in the world is, Joyce suggests, innate. To the objection that this is merely a "just so" story, he makes a plausible case that it is the best explanation for a significant body of anthropological and psychological evidence.

To this point, Joyce has essentially been answering a scientific question: has morality resulted from natural biological selection? After reaching an affirmative answer to this question, he devotes the last two chapters, and the conclusion, to a philosophical question: what difference should this make to the contents of our ethics, or to our metaethical views?

Some think that associating evolution and ethics leads to "evolutionary ethics," of which the most notorious example is "social darwinism" -- a view that Darwin himself never held -- which sees evolution as a moral force that we should allow to do its work unfettered. Social darwinists argued against social welfare, on the grounds that those who are not fit enough to survive in the marketplace should not be assisted in reproducing.

Joyce argues that social darwinism and more contemporary versions of what he calls "prescriptive evolutionary ethics" by Robert Richards, Richmond Campbell, Daniel Dennett, and William Casebeer all fail, although he does not think that they can all be brought down by invoking either the "naturalistic fallacy" or the rule against deriving an "ought" from an "is". Joyce gives rather more space than necessary to showing why this is so. Although there are admittedly counter-examples to the rule that no "ought" statement can follow from an "is" statement, the counter-examples are essentially, as Joyce himself says, "logical tricks". Since anything follows from a contradiction, "You ought not steal" follows from a contradiction. But so what? Tricks aside, Hume's puzzlement over how an "ought" could follow from a series of "is" statements was well-founded. Oddly, in a book that is otherwise precise to the point of pedantry about exactly what the naturalistic fallacy is and whether an "ought" can be deduced from an "is", Joyce twice (pp.145, 191) refers to utilitarianism as an example of naturalism. Since utilitarianism is generally regarded as a normative, and not a metaethical, theory, it is compatible with any metaethics. Sidgwick was an intuitionist utilitarian. J.J.C. Smart is a noncognitivist utilitarian.

In Chapter 6, "The Evolutionary Debunking of Morality," Joyce discusses the reverse of the view that we should take evolution as our moral guide. The debunker regards knowledge that some of our specific moral beliefs are the outcome of natural selection as casting doubt on their claim to be preceptions of moral truth, or moral fixed points with which no sound normative theory would clash. As elsewhere, Joyce states his own position cautiously. He has not argued that any moral belief is innate, but only that we have a "specialized innate mechanism" for acquiring moral beliefs, so that we are born ready to see things in a normative way. As he puts it, "moral concepts may be innate even if moral beliefs are not." It is the idea of a sweeping moral skepticism, not of debunking particular moral beliefs, that primarily interests Joyce. Of course, the mere fact that a capacity has evolved cannot be sufficient to debunk it. Knowing that our capacity for mathematics is the result of evolution does not lead us to doubt that 1 + 1 = 2. But as Joyce points out, the best possible explanation of this capacity is that it helps us to survive by tracking the real world -- if we see three leopards enter a thicket, notice two leaving, and therefore conclude that it is safe to go into the thicket, our reproductive prospects will be diminished. As we have seen, however, there are good explanations of our capacity to make moral judgments that do not assume that it is a faculty for perceiving some truth about the world. Moreover, Joyce argues, there is no fact about the world that can vindicate the inescapable authority that moral judgments purport to have. He concludes: "our moral beliefs are products of a process that is entirely independent of their truth" and while they might happen to be true, we have no reason for thinking that they are. Thus Joyce embraces something like John Mackie's metaethical "error theory," with the difference that whereas Mackie thought our moral language is mistaken because no moral propositions are true, Joyce defends only the more modest claim that we are not justified in endorsing any moral proposition.

Joyce's view is that an evolutionary understanding of morality discredits those who rely on their moral intuitions, since these intuitions are likely to have been subject to selective pressures which do not favor reliability. But we can distinguish the form of moral intuitionism that relies on specific moral intuitions about right and wrong -- essentially, our "common moral convictions" -- from the "philosophical intuitionism" espoused by Sidgwick, which seeks to find a small number of rationally self-evident moral axioms that can serve as the foundation for a normative theory. Our common moral convictions might indicate, for instance, that it is permissible to withdraw life-support from a terminally ill patient in pain, but wrong to give the same patient a lethal injection. Philosophical intuitionism might lead us to defend much more abstract principles, such as "the good of any one individual is of no more importance, from the point of view (if I may say so) of the Universe, than the good of any other; unless, that is, there are special grounds for believing that more good is likely to be realised in the one case than in the other."3 It is easy to see how our evolutionary history could account for our common moral convictions, but much more difficult to understand why it would have led us to something as abstract as the principle just quoted, especially since the latter seems contrary to the general preferences that evolutionary psychology predicts we will have, for one's own interests, those of one's kin, or of other members of one's group.

Whether there are any such rationally self-evident moral axioms remains open for debate. We can agree with Joyce that "We should reject or modify any theory that would render us epistemic slaves to the baby-bearing capacity of our ancestors" but we still need to think more about which theories fit this description.

1 Frans de Waal, Chimpanzee Politics, Jonathan Cape, London, 1982, pp. 205-7; reprinted in Peter Singer, ed., Ethics, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 1994, p.69.

2 Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass., 1996.

3 Henry Sidgwick, The Methods of Ethics, 7th edition, Macmillan, London, 1907, Book III, ch. 13, p.383.