The Evolution of Principia Mathematica: Bertrand Russell's Manuscripts and Notes for the Second Edition

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Bernard Linsky, The Evolution of Principia Mathematica: Bertrand Russell's Manuscripts and Notes for the Second Edition, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 407pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107003279

Reviewed by Alasdair Urquhart, University of Toronto


The second edition of Principia Mathematica is an odd and in many ways puzzling book. When Cambridge University Press decided to produce a second edition of the famous treatise by Whitehead and Russell, it appeared that it should be updated to reflect the work in logic since the first edition of 1910-1913. However, a substantial revision of the text would have entailed a massive rewriting, including renumbering of hundreds of propositions, and so was out of the question. Instead, a compromise was adopted; the original text was reproduced unchanged, except for the correction of minor errors. A new introduction was added, giving a sketch of ideas for a revision; in addition, there were three new appendices. Appendix A gives a new version of the theory of quantification, Appendix B purports to show how mathematical induction can be justified without the axiom of reducibility, and Appendix C is a philosophical discussion of the principle of extensionality.

The book under review has two major sections. Chapters 1 to 7 discuss the historical background and content of the added material, including the thorny questions of the exact nature of the proposed revisions in the new introduction, and the logical errors in Appendix B. Chapter 8 reproduces the list of definitions that Russell generously wrote out and sent to Rudolf Carnap, when the latter found it difficult to obtain a copy of Principia Mathematica. The remainder of the book contains typeset versions of manuscripts from the Russell Archives at McMaster University in Hamilton, Ontario. In addition to the manuscripts of the introduction and three appendices, the book also prints sets of notes that Russell used in working up the more finished manuscripts, including a draft entitled "Hierarchy of propositions and functions."

The new material (unlike Principia Mathematica itself) was entirely the work of Russell, as Whitehead explained in a note published in Mind in 1926 (Linsky argues convincingly that this note does not constitute a repudiation of Russell's work, as some have thought). Commentators such as Warren Goldfarb, Saul Kripke and Ray Monk have thought that the added sections show that Russell was somewhat out of touch with developments in logic since 1913. Russell provides a list of contributions to mathematical logic since the publication of the first edition, and these do contain some of the major publications of Hilbert, Bernays, Weyl, Brouwer, Tarski and others (though the list may in large part be the work of F.P. Ramsey). Chapter 3 of Linsky's book is devoted to a detailed discussion of this list, as well as a defence of Russell against the accusations of Goldfarb and others. In fact, the new material written by Russell does not reflect much of the work in logic since the first edition -- the direct influences on it are those of Wittgenstein, Sheffer and Nicod.

The new introduction gives some extremely sketchy ideas for a possible revision of the book. The most definite idea is that of reworking the propositional part by replacing the original primitive operators of disjunction and negation by the Sheffer stroke, and the propositional axioms by Nicod's single axiom and rule of inference. Russell even makes the bizarre suggestion that Sheffer himself undertake "a complete re-writing of Principia Mathematica" using his invention of a "new and very powerful method in mathematical logic." (The reader may recall that the paper in which Sheffer introduced his single operator for propositional logic was his only significant publication in logic.)

The remainder of Russell's new introduction is devoted to problems connected with the axiom of reducibility. The first edition of Principia Mathematica is based on the ramified theory of types, an extremely complicated system in which propositional functions are classified not only by their position in the simple type hierarchy, but also by their logical complexity (order), measured by their quantifier prefixes. The axiom of reducibility was added by Whitehead and Russell for purely pragmatic reasons, since without it nothing resembling the ordinary theory of the real numbers, or even ordinary number theory, can be derived.

Russell mentions briefly Leon Chwistek and his "heroic course of dispensing with the axiom without adopting any substitute," but remarks that this entails the sacrifice of a great deal of ordinary mathematics. As a tentative alternative, Russell considers a course "recommended by Wittgenstein for philosophical reasons," based on the assumption that "functions of propositions are always truth-functions, and that a function can only occur in a proposition through its values." The description of the proposal is vague and imprecise, and divergent interpretations of it have been given by Nino Cocchiarella, Gregory Landini, Allen Hazen and Jen Davoren, among others. Linsky gives some criticism of these varied approaches, but does not commit himself to a definite interpretation, instead recommending the study of the manuscripts for further evidence. In view of the extremely difficult problems in making sense of this material, his tentative approach seems eminently reasonable.

The introduction and Appendix A are already problematic. Things become even worse with the notorious Appendix B. In this Appendix, Russell claims to show that the integers of any order higher than 5 are the same as those of order 5, so that mathematical induction can be justified even in the absence of the axiom of reducibility. At the time of the publication of the second edition in 1927, nobody saw anything wrong with Russell's proof, not even the brilliant Frank Ramsey, who wrote in a letter of 20 February 1924 to Wittgenstein that Russell's "new stuff" was of no importance, but that all it really amounted to was "a clever proof of mathematical induction without using the axiom of reducibility" (31).

The first indication that something was seriously wrong appeared in Gödel's well known essay of 1944, "Russell's Mathematical Logic." There, Gödel points out that line (3) of the demonstration of Russell's proposition *89.16 is an elementary logical blunder, while the crucial *89.12 also appears to be highly questionable. It still remained to be seen whether anything of Russell's proof could be salvaged, in spite of the errors, but John Myhill provided strong evidence of a negative verdict by providing a model-theoretic proof in 1974 that no such proof as Russell's can be given in the ramified theory of types without the axiom of reducibility.

Linsky provides an interesting discussion of why Russell's errors were not detected until much later. The work of Gödel and Tarski on incompleteness and the undefinability of truth in languages of a fixed order, as well as their definability in higher order languages, no doubt were important in making it clear that there had to be a mistake in Russell's reasoning. Another possible reason that Gödel was the first to point out explicit errors is the fact that his work on the universe of constructible sets is an extension of the ramified theory of types to transfinite levels.

The material of the new introduction and Appendix B remains deeply puzzling. Gödel himself thought that implicit in it is a new version of the ramified theory of types, with more liberal rules for identification of classes of different orders; Linsky agrees with this suggestion, though the exact form of the new theory remains unclear. Various proposals have been made by Davoren, Hazen and Landini for formalization of this new theory, but the matter remains controversial. Linsky expresses a hope that the publication of Russell's notes will lead to further elucidation of what his intentions might have been.

The author has provided a significant service to Russell scholars by his painstaking and laborious work of typesetting Russell's manuscripts. The manuscript of the new introduction printed here does not show a great deal of significant differences from the published version, except for some additions and deletions. The same seems to be true for the manuscript of Appendix C. The notes for Appendix B and the manuscript "Hierarchy of propositions and functions" are more important, since these pieces shed considerable light on the difficult problems of interpretation discussed above.

The first edition of Principia Mathematica certainly played a very important role in the development of mathematical logic in the early twentieth century. How significant was the second edition? Russell's additions represent an uneasy and not entirely successful attempt to graft ideas stemming from Wittgenstein on the logical apparatus of the first edition. It does not seem to have exerted much direct influence on the development of formal logic in the succeeding decades (Linsky devotes Chapter 7 to an interesting description of the reception of the second edition). Its influence can be seen, however, in the field of philosophy. The discussions of the problems of extensionality and belief contexts in Appendix C look forward to later discussions in philosophical logic, and Russell's terminology of the "transparent" quality of truth-functional contexts was the inspiration for Quine's later phrase "referential opacity." For these reasons, philosophically inclined logicians and historians of logic are very much in the debt of Bernard Linsky for his careful and painstaking archival work.