The Exchange of Words: Speech, Testimony, and Intersubjectivity

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Richard Moran, The Exchange of Words: Speech, Testimony, and Intersubjectivity, Oxford University Press, 2018, 233pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190873325.

Reviewed by Peter J. Graham, University of California, Riverside


Sang-Hee just told me the store closes early tonight. I believe her and adjust my plans accordingly. What is it for her to tell me that? And what is it for me to believe her when she does? Furthermore, why do I acquire a good, sufficient reason to believe that the store closes early from believing Sang-Hee? Why do we learn -- acquire knowledge -- from believing what someone tells us? Richard Moran's book addresses these questions.

Moran's book has seven chapters, three previously published, including his well-known essay "Getting Told and Being Believed." In the preface, Moran says when incorporating these three that he has "tried to keep changes to a minimum while at the same time eliminating repetition across the chapters." I wish he had adopted more of a scorched-earth policy when it came to eliminating repetition. The book is repetitive across chapters, within chapters, and frequently even within paragraphs. Given that the average length of his paragraphs is one whole printed page (some are even two pages long), distinguishing what is new from what has come before frequently challenges the reader.

To approach Moran's answer to our first question, let's start with the Gricean approach to analyzing communicative acts in general. For the Gricean:

Speaker S means or communicates to an audience A by producing U iff:

  1. S intends U to produce in A response R;
  2. S intends that A recognize her intention (a);
  3. S intends that A's recognition of her intention (a) to function as at least a part of A's reason to R.

Call this the Gricean schema. Since R can be any number things, a Gricean categorizes different communicative act types by substituting different values for R. He might further distinguish different types by adding further details to one or more of the intentions, by adding further intentions, or even by adding conditions other than intentions.[1]

In his landmark 1957 article 'Meaning', Grice focused on telling an audience that P. Here is a fair characterization of his analysis:

Speaker S tells an audience A that P by producing U iff:

  1. S intends U to produce in A the belief that P;
  2. S intends that A recognize her intention (a);
  3. S intends that A's recognition of her intention (a) to function as (at least a part of) A's reason to believe that P.

The first intention is the informative intention; the second the communicative intention; and the third the Gricean intention.

Grice's original account faced challenges. Must I really intend for someone to believe me whenever I tell them something? What if I am just reminding them? Or what if I know for sure they won't believe me? Can't I still tell them that P without intending they come to believe that P? In response, Grice and Griceans weakened the account:

Speaker S tells an audience A that P by producing U iff:

  1. S intends U to lead A to actively think the thought that P, or the thought that S believes that P;
  2. S intends that A recognize her intention (a);
  3. S intends that A's recognition of her intention (a) to function as at least a part of A's reason to actively think that P, or the thought that S believes that P.[2]

A speaker who tells an audience that P according to this analysis might nevertheless still have the further intention that A come to believe that P by believing S believes that P, and taking that as a reason to believe that P, even though those intentions need not be a part of the analysis of telling. Getting others to believe that P can still be the primary function of telling others that P, even if intending them to believe that P isn't a part of the nuts and bolts of telling.

What is Moran's account of telling? Though he does not plug his account into the Gricean schema, the following captures his idea:

Speaker S tells an audience A that P by producing U iff:

  1. S intends A to come to possess a distinctive kind of reason to believe P;
  2. S intends that A recognize that she is overtly, intentionally, freely and self-consciously taking responsibility for the truth of her audience's (potential) belief that P -- thereby giving her addressee a right of complaint against her and so a right to sanction -- if she cannot fulfill these self-imposed responsibilities; and
  3. S intends that A's recognition of her intention (2) to function at least in part of the explanation of A's coming to possess a distinctive kind of reason to believe P.

For shorthand, let's call everything S intends that A recognize S is doing in (2) "assuring the audience that P." On Moran's view a speaker tells an audience that P only if S assures her audience that P.

Moran's account obviously differs from the Gricean, whether original or revised. Moran's first intention intends a different response and Moran's second intention is considerably richer indeed.

Moran's view of telling as assuring falls within a well-known tradition of thinking about speech acts in terms of a speaker taking responsibility for something -- committing herself to something -- vis-à-vis her audience. These views are then often called commitment views. C.S. Peirce had the idea at the end of the 19th century. William Alston developed perhaps the most worked-out taxonomy of speech acts in these terms in papers from the 1960s and a then a book published in 2000 (but drafted in the late 1970s). Other contemporary advocates include Robert Brandom, Michael Rescorla, John Searle, and Gary Watson, among many others.

"Commitment" views are often contrasted with Gricean intention-based views, for Gricean views, on the face of it, omit commitments. But insofar as we are taking about communicative acts, I think the contrast is overblown, for communicative acts necessarily involve intentions. Some -- assuring, for instance -- also involve commitments. Plugging Moran's view into the Gricean schema should make that obvious.

It is arguable, and Moran insists, that communicative acts also require an uptake condition. After all, communication means that something becomes "common" between sender and receiver. Is it the belief that P, or the possession of an epistemic reason to believe that P? No. You might communicate with me by telling me that P, but for all that I don't believe you or accept your telling me that P as a reason to believe that P. Rather, communication requires that the hearer recognize the speaker's communicative intention. That's the uptake communication requires. If I recognize that in uttering U you are trying to get me to believe P, or to possess a distinctive kind of reason to believe P, then you have told me that P. If I don't recognize your communicative intention, then you have only tried to tell me that P. Expressing admiration for Thomas Reid's remarks on the "social operations of the mind", since telling requires uptake, Moran argues that telling, like playing catch or shaking hands, is a social act of the mind, in Reid's sense.

Moran is keen to insist that tellings are not evidence for the truth of what the speaker tells her audience, but instead a distinctive kind of reason for belief. What does he mean by that? Moran means that if I tell you there is beer in the fridge, that gives you a very different kind of reason for belief than the reason you acquire when you watch me get up from the couch and walk to the fridge, obviously intent on acquiring another beer. For when I walk to the fridge, though you now have evidence that there is beer in the fridge, I haven't freely assumed responsibility for the truth of your belief. Fair enough. But if we use 'evidence' and 'reason' interchangeably (as many philosophers do), then even a speaker's assurance in Moran's sense is not only a reason to believe that P, but also evidence for thinking P is true, just a distinctive kind.

Moran thinks he's right about tellings and Griceans are wrong. Indeed, since he often substitutes 'asserting,' 'claiming', 'informing,' 'testifying' and other speech act verbs for 'telling,' Moran leads one to think that perhaps he thinks he is right about the whole category of "constative" or "assertive" speech act types, except for a handful of exceptions, like asserting the premises of an argument. Though I am happy to concede that Moran has isolated a distinct speech act type or category of speech act types -- Moran is right that sometimes we do assure others in his sense -- I am not happy to concede that he is right about the "core" or "fundamental" types of constative or assertive speech act types. It is surely an empirical, sociological question how often humans assure others through communication in Moran's sense. Linguistically capable young children rarely (if ever) do this, even though ordinary English is happy to say that young children tell us where their toys are, inform us they want more ice cream, and sometimes even claim that we are mistaken about bedtime. Furthermore, hedged assertions are still assertions, though hedged assurances are impossible.

To track the possibility that Grice and Moran are both right, though about different speech act types, we should remind ourselves of the polysemy of English speech act verbs.[3] We could then speak of 'Moranian tellings' or 'Gricean tellings'. Or we might just use the perfectly good English speech act verb 'assuring' to denote the speech act type Moran has in mind. Assuring in Moran's sense would then be one way of telling, informing, stating, asserting or testifying, not the only way.

That's Moran's answer to our first question, what is telling? For Moran, telling is assuring. What is Moran's answer to our second question, what it is for an audience to believe the speaker?

Moran first places a widely recognized necessary condition on believing the speaker. If the hearer comes to believe that P on the basis of the speaker's utterance, it must be because P is the content of the speaker's telling, not because of some other feature of the telling. For example, if Graham has a strong Scottish accent and that is why you come to believe he is Scottish, then you are not believing him that he is Scottish, even if that is what he is telling you.

What else is required? Moran's positive idea is that a hearer believes a speaker through accepting the speaker's offer of assurance. The audience then either thereby comes to believe that P, or to at least comes to believe that he now has a reason from the speaker's assurance to believe P. "Because the speaker has assured me that P -- an assurance freely chosen, with all that entails," a reflective addressee might reason, "I now have a reason to believe P."

But why should the hearer be so moved? It is because the hearer assumes (however this assumption is realized in his psychology) that "the belief in question has survived the speaker's reflection on it and is being presented to him with the speaker's epistemic backing and answerability for its justification" (p. 95). It's because, the hearer assumes, the speaker has sincerely assured him that P, and so really possesses a good reflectively accessible argument in favor of P.

Why should the hearer assume that? Though I don't recall Moran explicitly asking and answering this question, here's what I think his answer must be. The hearer will assume that if the speaker has bound herself to her addressee by taking responsibility for the truth of the belief that P -- if the speaker has freely given her addressee a right of complaint and so a right to sanction her if not P or if she cannot provide reasons for P -- then most likely she can provide reasons for the truth of P. "The speaker would not have assured me that P -- and freely given me a right of complaint, the right to impose a sanction -- unless she has a good argument for the truth of P," the hearer can reason. "Hence there is a good argument for the truth of P. Hence I now have a good reason to believe P." That's the distinctive kind of reason a speaker's assurance provides.

Moran then distinguishes two kinds of sincerity. The first way for a speaker to be sincere is to believe the proposition she tells her audience. That's the familiar sense. The second way is for the speaker to have the justification -- the reflectively accessible set of good reasons in favor of the truth of the proposition in question -- she commits herself to having. That's the sense that matters for the hearer coming to possess a good reason from accepting the speaker's assurance.

Why think they differ? Someone might believe the proposition they tell their audience but lack the justification; I might want you to believe what I believe, but I'm fooling you that I have good reflective reasons for thinking it is true. Or someone might have the justification for the proposition but not hold the belief herself. She might be self-deceived about what she believes, despite the good argument she possesses for its truth. Or she might, like a persuasive lawyer, have a great argument justifying the proposition that P, despite not believing P herself.

Relatedly Moran offers an account of Moore's paradoxical utterances such as "P, but I don't believe it." Moran's idea seems to be that if I tell you that P, and thereby assure you, then I present myself as having a good -- possibly conclusive -- argument for the truth of P. Hence I present P as belief-worthy for anyone, including me. But if I then disavow believing it myself, that undercuts the very idea that I have an argument -- certainly a conclusive argument -- for the truth of P.

Moran's essay "Getting Told and Being Believed" has been nearly universally read as arguing that only the speaker's addressee receives this distinctive kind of reason from a telling. On this interpretation no one other than me -- not even Sang-Hee's adolescent daughter sitting right next to her -- gets a reason to believe (at least not the same reason) that the store closes early from her telling me so. Benjamin McMyler and Edward Hinchman, for example, argue for just this kind of view under the banner of "the assurance view." The distinctive kinds of reasons for acceptance are exclusively second-personal reasons, reasons only for the addressee.

If that's how we are to use the label "the assurance view," then Moran's view isn't a version (even though he calls his view an assurance view -- from whence the literature largely derives the label), for Moran thinks both the addressee and the overhearer are in a position to receive the same reason to believe that P from the speaker's telling her addressee that P. Though he said as much in his original essay (pp. 67-68), additional material in his book helped me see why (pp. 124-127; 137-141).

Here's the idea. Though the right of complaint only goes to the addressee, knowing such an enforceable right of complaint is in place gives both the addressee and the overhearer the same reason to believe that the speaker can fulfill her self-imposed obligations, and so the same reason to believe that the belief in question has survived the speaker's reflection, and so the same reason to believe there is a good argument in favor of the truth of P. An analogy may help. Only the police have the right to enforce speed limits on highways. The existence of such sanctions gives not only the police a good reason to believe most drivers will not significantly exceed the designated speed, it gives other drivers that same reason as well. That means you don't have to be the person with the power to sanction to use the existence of a possible sanction as a reason to believe that people will behave so as to avoid the sanction. The sanction, and the reason it grounds, is the same, whether you are the one with the right to impose the sanction or simply a bystander passing by. That's why both the addressee of a telling and the overhearer acquire the same reason to believe that P from a speaker's telling the addressee that P. That's why Moran's view -- though understandably called an assurance view of telling -- isn't a version of what is now frequently called the assurance view of the epistemology of testimony. Moran analogizes his view to promises. If A promises B in front of C to attend the party, then B and C have the same epistemic reason to believe A will attend the party, exactly because B and C are equally aware of B's right of complaint should A fail to make an appearance.

Those are Moran's answers, as I understand them, to our first two questions. To tell is to offer an assurance. To believe the speaker is to accept the offer. What is Moran's answer to our third question, why do we learn -- come to know -- from believing a speaker?

On this issue Moran has little to say: "rather than being directly concerned with epistemological questions," he writes, "I am concerned here with the preconditions for there being an epistemic question of believing or disbelieving what one has been told." (pp. 16-17) He focuses on our first two questions -- as I have done here -- and not our third.

Moran's epistemological contribution is to argue that when a speaker assures her audience then the speaker provides her audience with a reason -- a defeasible, pro tanto reason -- to believe that P. And this clearly is not the whole story of the epistemology of tellings in this sense, for there are many questions still to be asked and answered. Must the speaker be sincere? Must her justification, if she is sincere, be a good one? Must she have knowledge? Must that knowledge be grounded in her justification, or can it be grounded in some other way? And if it is, does the justification really matter? And what about the hearer? Must the hearer have independent reasons to believe the speaker is sincere, or that the speaker has a good justification? If so, must they be reductive reasons, in the sense of reductionism in the epistemology of testimony? These are some of the many questions that epistemologists raise about so-called "testimony-based beliefs." Though Moran addresses a few, for the most part he only does so in passing. But given Moran's avowed concerns, that is to be expected. Moran's view of the metaphysics of assurance and acceptance can still be a start on the epistemological issues, if only a start.

On the other hand, though he does not develop the epistemological consequences of his view, he does spend some time arguing against a Gricean inspired view of the epistemology of testimony. He uses different names for this view as the chapters unfold: The Evidential View, The Indicative Picture, and The Telepathic Ideal. According to this view, the sole epistemic interest a hearer has when confronted with a speaker's telling that P is whether the speaker believes that P. "Aha," the audience thinks, "she has told me (in Grice's sense) that P, so she probably believes that P." A telling is then just "evidence" or an "indication" that the speaker believes that P. And if the hearer concludes that the speaker believes that P, that is not yet a reason for the hearer to believe P as well. The hearer must have some further reason to believe that the speaker's belief is true, a further reason not provided by the speech act itself. You can see why such a view might follow from the Gricean view of telling.

Moran then argues against this view. "If the epistemic import of what people say is at bottom that of an indication of what they believe, it would seem perverse for us to give any privileged [epistemic] status to . . . speech and assertion" for a person may lie so as to provide misleading evidence (p. 43). Wouldn't it be better -- if all we get at best from speech and assertion is fallible evidence for what people believe -- to rely instead, Moran asks repeatedly, on less fallible means of figuring out what people believe?

And it gets worse. For once we recognize that tellings (so understood) are deliberately designed to influence what we believe, doesn't that provide us in every case a reason to reject reliance on what we are told? "Ordinarily," he says,

if I confront something as evidence (the telltale footprint, the cigarette butt left in the ashtray) and then learn that it was left there deliberately, and even with the intention of bringing me to a particular belief, this will only discredit it as evidence in my eyes. It won't seem better evidence, or even just as good, but instead something like fraudulent, or tainted evidence. (p. 43)

If the view he opposes were true, we should not only always prefer better evidence for what others believe than their tellings, but we should not believe their tellings in the first place. The best we could do -- the ideal -- would be to remove speech altogether and deploy infallible telepathic mind-reading, for then the possibility of deceit (not to mention noise in the channel) would be circumvented, and at least then we would have a sure route to our knowledge of what other people believe.

Since the Gricean can't account for why we learn from others, then even if Moran hasn't addressed all the questions an epistemology of testimony faces, his view of tellings as assurances would have the upper-hand. Every epistemology of tellings must start with Moran's metaphysics of tellings.

There are at least two errors in Moran's case. First, we do not always have a better route -- observation of non-linguistic behavior -- to figure out what people believe. I might learn that Moran likes reading Proust from watching him read Remembrance of Things Past from beginning to end -- we've both got a lot of time to kill -- but it would be impossible to figure out anything he believes about tellings without reading his book or asking him directly. For us, speech is not only a much more effective tool for learning what other people believe -- asking is easy -- but for a vast number of beliefs, it's the only way.[4]

Second, and more importantly, it is not a priori necessary that whenever we confront a piece of evidence and then learn it was left deliberately, even with the intention of bringing us to a particular belief, that it will discredit it as evidence in our eyes. In Moran's examples (the footprint, the cigarette) we imagine a story where someone placed the evidence so as to mislead, possibly to frame an innocent man. We then have Moran's intuitive reaction. But imagine instead a different story where the evidence is deliberately produced for our epistemic benefit. We then fill in the background differently and consequently have a different reaction to the discovery. To deepen the point, imagine a theist who believes all of the evidence for the laws of nature was produced deliberately by God so that we might read his thoughts. Moran's principle would have you believe this God is no better than a fraud. Whether a deliberately produced piece of evidence is good evidence or fraudulent depends on the details of the case. Being deliberately produced isn't enough.[5] I was not persuaded by Moran's reasoning when I first read it over fifteen years ago. There is nothing new in the book that changes my mind. Gricean tellings might provide reasons for belief, just a different kind of reason than Moran's distinctive kind.

Moran's book is sure to be widely read. It does more to bring to light the moral psychology characteristic of tellings understood as assurances than any other work I know. His book raises challenges for other views, introduces interesting and evocative distinctions, and puts together in one place Moran's sustained reflections on the way we provide others a distinctive kind of reason for belief though normatively binding ourselves though the exchange of words. I agree that assurances and acceptances in Moran's sense play a part in a total understanding of the epistemology of testimony. But I do not agree they cover the whole terrain. There is much more to the metaphysics and epistemology of testimony still to explore.


I am grateful to conversations with, and comments from, Matthew Chrisman, Luca Ferrero, Lizzie Fricker, Sandy Goldberg, and Coleen Macnamara.

[1] See chapter three of Kent Bach and Robert M. Harish, Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts (MIT Press, 1979).

[2] See Stephen Neale, "Paul Grice and the Philosophy of Language" Linguistics and Philosophy 15 (1992): 509-559.

[3] See Bach and Harnish, pp. 42-48.

[4] Joseph Shieber, Testimony (Routledge, 2015), p. 156.

[5] See Arnon Keren, "On the Alleged Perversity of the Evidential View of Testimony" Analysis 71 (2012).