The Existence of God, 2d ed.

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Richard Swinburne, The Existence of God, 2d ed., Oxford University Press, 2004, 363pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199271682.

Reviewed by Joshua Golding, Bellarmine University


Richard Swinburne is one of the foremost current philosophers of religion, and, as he states in his preface, this book is the 'central book' of all that he is written in the field. The first edition was published in 1979, and, deservedly, it has been hailed as something of a modern classic. It was a tour de force when it was first published, and now it is even more sophisticated. A new edition was published in 1991, but without any substantial change in the main text. In the present edition, Swinburne has revised several chapters, added notes, and also made minor changes throughout the book. However, as the author himself says, the main strategy, major claims, and overall plan of the book remain the same. This review briefly summarizes the book, and then poses a few questions.

The overall aim of the book is to argue for the claim that the proposition God exists is more probable than not, or, to put it somewhat more technically, that the probability that God exists is greater than ½. After some stage-setting chapters which discuss the nature of inductive arguments and the nature of explanation, Swinburne describes the hypothesis that God exists. He argues that the hypothesis is simple in roughly the same sense that many successful scientific theories have been 'simple', that is, not belabored with complicated presuppositions or assumptions that don't hang together well, seem arbitrary, or cry out for further explanation. This is an important claim for Swinburne, because, he argues that hypotheses which are simple have a higher 'prior probability' than hypotheses which are not simple. The prior probability of a hypothesis is the probability that we would assign it before judging it against the evidence (for or against it) given to us in our experience of the world. Furthermore, Swinburne argues that the hypothesis that God exists is vast in its explanatory scope. Roughly stated, since God is conceived as infinite, omnipotent, and omniscient, it will turn out that for anything and everything that happens anywhere and any time in the universe, we may conceivably refer to God as the ultimate explanation.

Swinburne then goes on to formulate, in masterful fashion, several of the classic arguments for God's existence, as well as some lesser known arguments. These include, the Cosmological Argument, the Teleological Argument, the Argument from Consciousness, the Argument from Providence, the Argument from Miracles, and finally the Argument from Religious Experience. These arguments proceed in order from more general aspects of the world (its existence; its order) to more specific aspects of the world (the fact that human consciousness exists; the fact that humans have an opportunity to provide for themselves and others; the fact that there is testimony regarding miracles; the fact that many religious people purportedly experience God). In each case, he concedes that the arguments do not deductively prove that there is a God. (He completely avoids any a priori attempt to prove God's existence, such as the Ontological Argument.) He also concedes that in no case does any single argument by itself show that God's existence is more probable than not. His strategy is more complicated, in the following way.

First, he settles on the more modest claim that, in each case, the evidence confirms or increases the probability of God's existence. In other words, the hypothesis that God exists is higher given the evidence (e.g., that the world exists, that it exhibits order, etc.) than it would be if the evidence were otherwise (if the world did not exist; if there were no order, etc.). He then builds a cumulative case designed to show that all of the arguments together (not counting the Argument from Religious Experience) make it plausible to believe that God's existence is, at the very least, not improbable, that is, not less than ½. The modest nature of this claim makes Swinburne's approach up to this point very appealing indeed. Finally, delivering the final blow on the very last page of the main text, Swinburne argues that religious experience tips the balance of probability in favor of God's existence. In expounding the argument from religious experience, he makes ample use of what he calls the Principle of Credulity, which says that unless we have some reason to suspect or reject an experience, we should take that experience as veridical. And, since he has already shown that God's existence is not improbable without religious experience, it follows that we should rely on religious experience to conclude that the probability that God's existence is greater than ½. Q.E.D.

So much for a summary of the book. Before moving on to some criticisms, and at the risk of seeming picayune, it's worth noting an apparent typographical error in the text. Early on in the book, Swinburne takes pains to point out that even if, individually, none of the classic arguments successfully substantiates God's existence, this does not forestall the possibility that all the arguments taken together may succeed in substantiating God's existence. On p. 12, Swinburne seems to be making that point that the skeptic should not assume that by refuting each argument individually, he has thereby refuted the cumulative case in favor of God's existence. But then the text reads, "This 'divide and rule' technique with the arguments is admissible." (The italics are mine.) Unless I am completely missing Swinburne's train of thought, the text should read inadmissible. Indeed the corresponding original 1979 text reads inadmissible (p. 13).

Now for some critical comments. In the course of his discussion, Swinburne considers the Problem of Evil. In classic fashion, he claims that the problem of evil does not refute God's existence, because it is plausible to think that God would have a justifiable reason to allow some temporary evils for the sake of some greater good (such as the challenge to overcome evil). But Swinburne concedes that evil reduces the probability that God exists. This is because, according to Swinburne, in order to escape the problem the evil, the theist must add the hypothesis that there is an afterlife in which those innocent souls who have suffered evil or harm in this world may be requited. Swinburne claims this additional hypothesis reduces the probability of God's existence because it makes that hypothesis less simple. (Incidentally, this is one area where Swinburne's exposition here differs somewhat from his exposition in the earlier edition. He now considers that the problem of evil is more of a challenge to theism than he did before.) But, he claims, evil reduces that probability only somewhat, because, if there is a God, we might very well expect God both to allow evil (for the sake of greater goods) and so we would expect God to create an afterlife. In other words, the hypothesis that God exists and that there is an afterlife are conceptually linked in such a way that adding the second one to the first is not that much of a complication after all.

However, a skeptic might insist that the problem is more than lack of simplicity. The problem is that, when Swinburne reaches the end of his argument, it remains the case that in order to establish the probability that there is a God, we also face the challenge of whether there is ample reason to believe in the afterlife. Skepticism about whether there is an afterlife translates into skepticism about whether God exists. Unless there is independent justification for the belief in the afterlife, the probability that there is a God remains seriously in doubt due to the problem of evil. It is of course possible to come up with a justification for a belief in the afterlife, but that's another matter entirely. Swinburne cannot respond that since religious experience probabilifies the hypothesis that there is a God, ipso facto, it probabilifies the hypothesis that there is an afterlife. So much of religious experience has to do with the experience of a 'presence', yet very little to do, at least in any direct way, with the experience of an afterlife. Given Swinburne's approach up to this point, it seems that until and unless there is good evidence for the belief in an afterlife, the problem of evil significantly lowers the probability that God exists, and thus threatens Swinburne's conclusion at the end of the book.

Another potential criticism concerns Swinburne's heavy reliance on simplicity. Using science as a model, Swinburne argues that, a simple hypothesis has an inherently higher prior probability than a complex one. But why should we assume that this is so? Surely, a simple hypothesis has the advantage that it is more easily testable than a complex one. However, perhaps simplicity itself is not a virtue of a theory, unless the theory is also testable. In what way is the hypothesis that God exists testable? Swinburne might respond in that if God exists, we would expect the universe to continue existing, the order of the universe to remain the same, etc., and in this way, the hypothesis is continually confirmed. But (successful) science gives us theories which are testable or confirmable in new ways that we didn't know about or would not have expected before the theories were proposed. Is there anything analogous in the case of the hypothesis that God exists? If not, perhaps simplicity by itself is not a virtue.

Finally, another criticism concerns his application of the Principle of Credulity to religious experience. The Principle of Credulity says that we should trust the deliverances of experience, unless we have a reason to doubt their validity. Now, a skeptic would argue that religious experience is the result of wishful thinking or projection. It seems very plausible that even if God did not exist, people would be inclined to imagine that there is a God and even imagine that they are having experiences of God, when in fact their experience is not veridical. So perhaps the Principle of Credulity should be restricted in those cases where wishful thinking is, a priori, a very plausible explanation for why someone might have a certain experience. Perhaps the tests and checking procedures for a religious experience should be more rigorous than in other cases. The theory that religious experience is delusionary would also explain some of the vast differences which different religious people claim to have in their 'experience' of God, namely, that people 'experience' what they want to experience.

Though I am sure Swinburne would have responses to these questions, it seems to me that ultimately, the only satisfactory way to address these questions is either to come up with an a priori proof that God exists, or with a better inductive argument for God's existence, or to 'go pragmatic', that is, to argue that one should take into account the pragmatic considerations in whether or not one should believe, or assume for practical purposes, that God exists. The latter strategy is perhaps the easiest. The theist can encourage us to think about what is the pragmatic difference in whether one assumes that God exists and lives accordingly, or whether one chooses not to do so. What is the potential value at stake in living a religious life (or in not doing so), if God does exist (or if God does not exist)? In effect, Swinburne does something like this in his other book, Faith and Reason. As Swinburne might legitimately point out, this is no longer to argue that the hypothesis God exists is objectively probable, but rather to argue that the belief in God, or assumption for practical purpose that God exists, is justifiable or rational in some other way. However, it may be the best the theist can do, until and unless more compelling empirical evidence of God's existence is forthcoming.