The Existence of God: An Exposition and Application of Fregean Meta-Ontology

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Stig Børsen Hansen, The Existence of God: An Exposition and Application of Fregean Meta-Ontology, De Gruyter, 2010, 193pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783110245356.

Reviewed by Joshua Golding, Bellarmine University


This book aims to accomplish two different but related tasks. One goal is to present and defend a Fregean approach to meta-ontology. The other is to apply this approach to a certain question about the ontological status of God. The book has five chapters. The first two motivate and present elements of the Fregean approach to meta-ontology. The third chapter applies that approach to a certain question about God and engages in a linguistic analysis of certain passages in the Bible. The fourth and fifth chapters revert to a defense of the Fregean approach to meta-ontology against certain objections. This book should be of interest to scholars of Frege, philosophy of language, and metaphysics (particularly the realism/anti-realism debate), as well as analytically trained scholars of philosophy of religion. Biblical scholars may also find chapter three interesting, though they may have difficulty following the discussion if they are not also linguistic philosophers. Indeed, much of the book is not easy to follow unless one is well schooled in the scholarly literature inspired by the work of Frege and Wittgenstein, including the works of Michael Dummett, Crispin Wright, Bob Hale, and others.

As Hansen explains, meta-ontology is the branch of philosophy that deals with the meaning of the term 'existence' and related terms, such as 'entity' and 'object'. The Fregean approach to meta-ontology is characterized by the notion that linguistic categories are prior to ontological ones and is also driven by what is known as 'the context principle', which states that the meaning of a term can only be known or intelligently asked for in the context of some proposition in which that term is used.

Based on this approach, Hansen develops and defends the view that the question of whether a notion might plausibly be thought of as an 'object' (i.e., something of the sort that might or might not exist) can be settled by appeal to the syntactic category under which that notion falls. It is sometimes claimed that the notion of existence is ambiguous, and that different things must be said to 'exist' in radically different ways. (Hansen refers to this as the 'disambiguation strategy' -- though perhaps it is more aptly termed, the 'ambiguation strategy'.) Such claims have been made about numbers, universals, and, of course, God. Hansen wishes to argue against this tendency and to establish a univocal meaning for the words 'existent' and 'object.' If a term behaves linguistically in certain ways and passes certain syntactic tests, then it counts as naming an object or an entity. Basically, Hansen claims that the category of an object is derived from the category of a sortal. A sortal is a 'count noun,' such as 'man' or 'tiger', which represents something that can be counted; we can effectively count how many men or tigers there are in the room (or in the zoo). Hansen recognizes that in some cases it might be difficult to tell whether a given piece of language counts as a sortal; but in some cases, it is rather clear that some piece of language does count as a sortal. On this view, to be an object is to be a thing of a certain countable sort. It does not matter whether in fact there should turn out to be zero or only one of the items in question; so long as it is in principle possible for us to intelligently ask and answer the question, 'how many F's are there?' we can safely say that the term F is a sortal. It follows that, given that F is a sortal, anything which is described as an F is plausibly regarded as an object.

While Frege and many of his followers applied this approach to address the ontological status of numbers and other abstract entities, Hansen applies it to a question about the ontological status of God. The question is whether it is plausible to think of God as an object or an entity, that is, as something of the sort that might or might not exist. Some theists have claimed that God is not best construed as an object, and some atheists have claimed that the notion of God is so confused that it cannot be taken as naming any object whatsoever. Utilizing the Fregean approach described above, Hansen argues that the notion of God is quite plausibly understood as naming an object. Basically, he claims that the use of the term 'God' and related words as used in the Bible and in ordinary speech pass the requisite syntactic tests for qualifying as naming an 'object.' The term 'God' exhibits the syntactic behavior of a proper name, and we are also in possession of a relevant sortal, namely, the term, 'god', by which we can intelligently ask the question, "How many gods are there?" Another way in which the Bible describes God is by the designation 'king'. This term too is a sortal. It follows that 'God' is plausibly construed as naming an object.

Hansen hastens to emphasize that his claim should not be taken to imply that there are no significant differences between God and such ordinary objects as tables and chairs. God is conceived as eternal and omnipotent; tables and chairs are neither. It is also possible that the type of evidence or reasoning used to support the belief in the existence of God may be different from the type of evidence or reasoning used to support the belief in the existence of tables and chairs. More to the point, Hansen readily admits that there are various types of sortals. Still, once a sortal, always a sortal. Thus the point remains that since 'god' functions as a sortal, the notion of God is properly construed as naming an object. Finally, Hansen notes that it is not his project to enter the debate about whether or not God exists, but only to clarify the meaning of the claim that God exists. The question of whether God exists is a matter that lies outside the scope of philosophy proper, which, in Hansen's view, focuses more on the clarification of the meanings of words, and less on settling questions of fact.

So much for a summary of the book. The remainder of this review contains a few critical remarks.

Hansen argues that there is a syntactic test for determining whether 'God' names an object. This syntactic test is employed on passages in the Bible and on ordinary religious language. However, it seems to this reviewer that many theistic philosophers would readily admit that, based on ordinary language and passages in the Bible, it is more than plausible to construe 'God' as naming an object that is purported to exist. In fact, some might insist that this claim is trivially true and that it needs no sophisticated linguistic philosophical analysis to realize that the Bible speaks about God as an 'object' that purportedly exists. Yet, one might make a distinction between ordinary religious language (including Biblical language) on the one hand and a philosophically sophisticated account of theism on the other hand. As Moses Maimonides wrote, quoting from the Talmud, "the Torah speaks in the language of ordinary men." After all, the Torah also describes God as having a mighty hand, an outstretched arm, and eyes that range over all the earth, and so forth. These locutions serve a role in bringing the ordinary man closer to some understanding of divine truth, but the philosophical cognoscenti know better than to think that these locutions accurately depict God. Rather, these locutions are mere metaphors for deeper truths. Thus, it could be argued that Hansen's entire project misses the point. Of course, in Biblical and ordinary language God is depicted as an object. The question remains whether an intellectually sophisticated theism needs or wants to do this, and whether such a move will succeed in rendering a coherent notion of God.

A second critical point concerns Hansen's discussion in the third chapter of the behavior of the word 'God' in the Hebrew Scriptures. He notes that the word 'god' is of course an English word, and that the Hebrew word which is often translated as 'God' or 'god' or sometimes 'gods' is elohim. Thus the first verse in Genesis reads, "In the beginning, elohim created the world." As Hansen notes, the form of the word 'elohim' is plural, yet in most cases when the Hebrew Scriptures speak of the elohim who created the world and who speaks to the prophets, the verb forms which are used are singular, with some rare exceptions. Hansen investigates the use of the sortal elohim primarily by taking up a close analysis of the passage in Exodus where Moses is confronted by an elohim who makes various claims about himself and gives various instructions to Moses. So far so good.

Hansen then takes some pains to try to show that the notion of elohim in the Scriptures is best understood as approximating the notion of a king. Yet, he fails to note that in Hebrew, the word elohim means a judge, ruler, or a power. The word 'elohim' stems from the root el which means power or force. Thus, in some cases the term 'elohim' is applied to a human judge; see for example Exodus 22:8-9. Furthermore, when, for example, the Hebrew Scriptures (as in Psalms 136:2) speak of "elohay ha-elohim" -- which is often translated as 'the god of gods' -- this phrase is perhaps better translated as the 'judge of judges' or the 'power of powers,' or, as one might say, the ultimate judge or ultimate power. Now, it is unclear to this reviewer how this point would affect Hansen's analysis. Perhaps he would welcome this point, as it seems only to underscore the claim that the word 'elohim' is a sortal, since one can intelligently ask the question, "How many judges are there in a room?" On the other hand, it is not clear if one can intelligently ask and answer the question, "How many powers are there?" -- especially if one has in mind all the powers that are in the universe. In any case, Hansen's discussion surely would have been more complete if it took into account the plain meaning of the word 'elohim'.

A similar point concerns Hansen's discussion of the tetragrammaton. He duly notes that the proper name of God in the Hebrew Scriptures is the tetragrammaton or 'YHVH' -- a word made up of the four Hebrew letters, yod, heh, vav, heh. (The proper pronunciation of this name remains a mystery to this day; thus the common practice of avoiding any attempt to transliterate this word.) Yet Hansen fails to note that the word 'YHVH' seems etymologically related to the root of the word for being in Hebrew. Thus for example, in Hebrew the words for 'was', 'is', and 'will be' are, respectively, hayah, hoveh, and yihyeh -- these words are constructed from different combinations of the yod, heh, and vav. Again, it is unclear how this would affect Hansen's analysis overall. Does the proper name for God in the Hebrew Scriptures have a meaning related to the notion of being? Could it be that the term 'YHVH' means something like, "being itself" or "source of being"? If so, what implications might this have for the ontological status of YHVH or 'God'? Is the term 'being' plausibly treated as a sortal? Hansen does not consider these important questions.

A final and related point concerns Hansen's claim that "We never in the Old Testament find a move toward monotheism -- the belief in one god only … except what we might call monolatry or … henotheism." (p. 101) Presumably, what he has in mind is that the Hebrew Scriptures teach that there are many "gods", and that the Israelites are commanded to worship only one of these many "gods." Surely, the Hebrew Scriptures teach that indeed there are many elohim, that is, there are many "powers" in the universe. But perhaps the central teaching of the Hebrew Scriptures is that there is but one ultimate power or ruler (elohay ha-elohim) who calls himself YHVH (Exodus 3:15), who created the world (Genesis 1-2), who controls nature and all of its powers (Exodus 8:6,18; 9:29), who punishes the wicked and rewards the righteous (Psalm 92:10-15) and who is the ultimate elohim both in heaven and on earth (Deuteronomy 4:39). It is not simply that the Israelites are commanded to worship one out of many elohim; rather the character of this elohim is depicted as unique and supreme. Surely, this represents a move toward monotheism, if not monotheism itself.