The Extended Mind

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Richard Menary (ed.), The Extended Mind, MIT Press, 2010, 382pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262014038.

Reviewed by William Ramsey, University of Nevada, Las Vegas


In 1998, Andy Clark and David Chalmers published an essay in Analysis entitled "The Extended Mind" that proposed and defended a radical claim. They argued that minds can and sometimes do extend beyond our skin out into the broader world, in non-biological representational systems and devices. To properly understand minds, they claimed, we need to recognize not just how they interact with the outside world; we also must recognize that aspects of the non-biological world are, in certain situations, actually constitutive of them. Clark and Chalmers' article has since prompted a variety of responses. Richard Menary's new volume presents fourteen such reactions that (along with Clark and Chalmers' original essay) defend, criticize, or further develop and advance the extended mind hypothesis (hereafter, EMH). Despite varying widely in quality, these essays offer an interesting and often provocative array of perspectives on the physical boundaries of mentality.

The volume has two apparent but unstated agendas. One goal is to defend the general outlook of EMH from various challenges. All but 3 of the essays are strongly supportive, and even the introduction openly endorses the EMH stance. There is, of course, nothing wrong with this, but readers should not expect equal treatment by both sides of this issue. The second objective is to help develop a "second-wave" version of EMH that pushes EMH in a different direction. To better see how these agendas play out, it will help to first consider two central principles that inform many of the discussions.

The first principle is endorsed in Clark and Chalmers' cornerstone essay and has come to be known as the "parity principle":

If, as we confront some task, a part of the world functions as a process which, were it done in the head, we would have no hesitation in recognizing as part of the cognitive process, then that part of the world is … part of the cognitive process. (p. 29)

Like many philosophical tenets, the parity principle is motivated by a central thought-experiment. Clark and Chalmers ask us to imagine an Alzheimers' victim, Otto, who relies upon a trusty and ever-present notebook to store vital information. Because the notebook functions so much like a normal person's memory, Clark and Chalmers suggest it actually is Otto's memory, with its inscriptions serving as his long-standing beliefs. The parity principle is largely driven by functionalist intuitions. If functional role is what defines mental states and processes, then just as it is prejudicial to claim that minds must be instantiated in neurons, so too, EMH proponents suggest, it is equally prejudicial to assume that minds must be instantiated within the skull. When devices, symbol systems, and other things in the world function sufficiently like things we normally regard as cognitive, then they too should be regarded as cognitive and, indeed, as parts of our minds.[1]

The second credo is an alleged fallacy that, according to Fred Adams and Ken Aizawa, EMH proponents commit -- the "coupling-constitution fallacy":

The fallacious pattern is to draw attention to cases, real or imagined, in which some object or process is coupled in some fashion to some cognitive agent. From this, one slides to the conclusion that the object or process constitutes part of the agent's cognitive apparatus or cognitive processing. (p. 68)

In their contribution, Adams and Aizawa insist that there is no good reason for treating Otto's notebook as part of his cognitive system, as opposed to external tools that assist his cognitive activity. It is one thing to be causally or computationally relied upon by a mind when it engages in various intellectual tasks, it is another thing to actually be a component of such a mind. To bolster their claim, Adams and Aizawa propose their own criterion for mentality: non-derived intentionality, which is lacking in external symbol systems like Otto's notebook.

There is an obvious tension between these two precepts. If it is a fallacy to treat things coupled to a cognitive agent as parts of a cognitive system, then the parity principle is in trouble. If, on the other hand, functional parity is sufficient for mentality, then certain coupled elements really are parts of our minds. In certain respects, the first four chapters of Menary's volume, and many parts of subsequent chapters, involve a debate over which of these two principles should be given priority. Clark's second essay, "Memento's Revenge", is partly designed to re-affirm and defend the parity principle from various criticisms. It is followed by a further rebuttal by Adams and Aizawa in which they answer criticisms of their own coupling-constitution fallacy. This, in turn, is followed by a further (re)rebuttal by Clark, which, as might be expected, further defends parity and rejects the charge of fallacious reasoning.

The exchanges in these first four chapters adopt a dialectic that has become commonplace in debates about EMH. Because of the emphasis upon parity, proponents emphasize how much extra-cranial systems function just like intra-cranial systems and critics emphasize how much they don't. Or, alternatively, proponents emphasize how dissimilar from one another conventional inner cognitive operations can be (thereby suggesting various functional differences are not critical), while critics emphasize their core uniformity. For instance, Clark repeatedly highlights the ways in which external elements help us in the same ways that internal elements do, and also the degree to which we already acknowledge different types of capacities like memory. Adams and Aizawa, on the other hand, stress how much things like Otto's notebook is unlike biological memory (because it must be read and interpreted) and how biologicality provides a unified base for mentality.

While these exchanges are often insightful, they fail to accomplish any clear consensus or advance the discussion very far. The debate would have benefitted from some prior agreement on what counts as getting it right -- on, say, how we might discern the difference between a cognitive system's parts and non-parts. Without this, the two sides often talk past each other. For example, Clark (along with Menary) criticizes Adams and Aizawa for confusedly thinking that the extended mind position entails that objects (like Otto's notebook) can be intrinsically cognitive, irrespective of whatever role they are playing. As Clark points out, no proponent of EMH thinks that; it is essential that the object be properly conjoined or integrated with a brain. Yet, in fact, this is an uncharitable interpretation of Adams and Aizawa, whose whole argument is designed to show that integration with a brain is not enough.

The other critics of EMH in this volume also emphasize a lack of functional parity between the inner and outer. Robert Rupert focuses on language processing and persuasively argues that the usual explananda of cognitive science undermine the EMH outlook. Developmental psychologists want to know how children come to learn a language, and for that we need to regard the cognitive agent as a persisting, unified system. But extended coupled systems are short-lived -- unlike biological sub-systems, external components attach only for brief periods. It is thereby hard to see how we could have a science about a series of short-lived hybrid systems. John Preston, like Adams and Aizawa, describes dissimilarities between the inscriptions in Otto's notebook and beliefs as understood by common sense. Preston's focus is upon access; as he notes, while we have first-person authority regarding what we believe, externally stored information lacks this access: Otto needs to use perception to discover not just what is in the world, but also what he believes. He claims that these functional dissimilarities undermine EMH.

Although Clark does not directly respond to Rupert or Preston, it is easy to imagine his rebuttal: yes, these dissimilarities do exist, but they are not essential and are no more interesting than other dissimilarities between conventional internal states and sub-systems. So while critics challenge EMH by emphasizing a lack of functional parity between the inner and outer, proponents insist these functional dissimilarities don't matter. Yet this discussion is in need of a prior and principled way of demarcating those functional properties that make something part of a cognitive system from those functional properties that do not. This is a topic that Michael Wheeler attempts to address in his clear and interesting defense of extended functionalism. Wheeler acknowledges that the debate over parity often slips into the type of standoff between conservative and liberal functionalists that we see here between Clark and his critics. Wheeler offers a reasonable strategy for resolving this impasse: we should ask, counterfactually, would we continue regarding a conventional cognitive state or process as mental if it happened to lack the property in question? If the answer is "yes", then we should not exclude external elements just because they happen to lack that feature. For example, if a lesion caused a person's memory to stop displaying generation effects, would we stop treating this faculty as real memory? Presumably not. Thus, (contra Rupert, 2004) generation effects are not essential for memory.

Despite this sensible proposal, it is doubtful that it can always break the stalemate. If, say, a person's beliefs were to lose the property of first-person access, would they still count as real beliefs? I suspect Clark would claim that they would (insisting that this difference doesn't matter), whereas Preston would say they wouldn't (insisting this difference does matter).

But even if Wheeler's strategy does help, there is another worry raised by Rupert that deserved greater attention than provided in this volume. Insofar as the adoption of EMH would still require acknowledging the same critical distinctions between what is inner and what is outer, between what is biological and what isn't, the worry is that the adoption of EMH would amount to nothing more than a re-labeling. We now investigate the ways minds interact with non-mental things like public words and symbols. An EMH revolution would involve the same divisions; we would just start talking about investigating the ways the biological parts of our minds interact with the non-biological parts of our minds. Not much would change except the words we use. This worry is substantially exacerbated when we turn to the essays promoting the second goal of this volume. This is because those essays embrace (rather than downplay) the distinctions between what's in the skull and what's outside.

With the type of EMH described thus far, both sides have leaned upon the parity principle -- upon the functional similarity or dissimilarity of outer states and processes with conventional (i.e., inner, biological) cognitive states and processes to make their case either for or against EMH. But there is a completely different outlook that forms the foundation of the second-wave perspective. The proponents of this new outlook openly abandon the parity principle in favor of what one author (Sutton) refers to as the "complementarity principle". This latter principle rejects the idea that external factors must be functionally similar to conventional mental states and processes to qualify as cognitive. Instead, what matters is integration with biological systems to form a broader, hybrid cognitive system. For these authors, Otto's notebook isn't part of Otto's mind because it functions just like Otto's old memory. Instead, it is part of his mind because it is systematically and reciprocally integrated with his biological brain during various episodes of cognition. By replacing the parity principle with the complementarity principle, proponents of second-wave EMH can simply side-step those critics who complain that what's extra-cranial is not functionally similar to what's intra-cranial.

Menary's own contribution, along with his introduction, provides a clear articulation of second-wave EMH. He offers a task-based conception of a cognitive process which is then used to support an externalist conception of cognitive systems. For him, what makes outer items truly cognitive is not parity but rather the distinctive roles they play in the overall performance of a task that is cognitive in nature. If, say, the task is doing long division with pencil and paper, then the pencil and paper serve as components of an extended cognitive system, not because they resemble something neurological when division is done in the head, but rather because they are integral parts of a system performing a cognitive task: "The primary motivation for cognitive integration is the brute fact of our embodiment, especially our bodily manipulation of environmental vehicles" (p. 229).

Along similar lines, John Sutton joins Menary in developing a second-wave EMH position. To illustrate his complementarity principle, Sutton discusses two historical examples. The first involves Elizabethan actors at the Globe theater, who were required to perform an incredibly large number of different roles with minimal rehearsal. This was possible only because the physical lay-out of the sets, social variables, and various props served as information-bearing elements that helped to guide the actors' performance. The second example concerns the medieval memory palaces used by monks and scholars for storing large amounts of information. With this mnemonic strategy, buildings or familiar streets were memorized and then used to store various bits of information for later retrieval. Sutton claims this qualifies as a form of extended cognition, though I had a hard time understanding how it does. Given that the process involves everything being internalized (with memorized images of spatial geography used as mnemonic aids), just how this is supposed to support EMH is a bit mysterious.

Robert Wilson also offers an intriguing essay that can be seen as supporting second-wave EMH, though he initially presents an argument that appears to embrace parity. Wilson focuses upon "meaning making" -- our employment of various different internal and external representational states and devices for various purposes. Just as developmental systems theory helps us to see how various external factors contribute to organismic inheritance and development, so too a proper understanding of our status as "semantic engines" demands that we treat external symbols, signs, and linguistic tools as parts of our own cognitive apparatus. Ultimately, Wilson suggests that the specific form or location of these "mental representations" is less important to our understanding of intentionality than the fact that they play some sort of causal role in perception and behavior.

Language is also the focus of the chapter authored by David Spurrett and Stephen Cowley, who regard language as an outgrowth of more primitive "utterance activities". They propose that communicative gestures and acts sometimes give rise to a type of extended cognition in which two communicators should not be viewed as two distinct individuals, but rather as a complex hybrid. When a Zulu mother deliberately dominates the perceptual and behavioral field of her infant to calm the child, Spurrett and Cowley suggest the infant's mind is "colonized" by the mother's.

All of these authors make a strong case for thinking that various outer, non-biological elements that are markedly different from internal elements are nevertheless important (indeed, necessary) for specific cognitive tasks and activities. They make a strong case for a high degree of integration. Unfortunately, they fail to make a strong case for treating these integrated external structures as parts of an expanded mind. There is nothing here, as far as I can see, that would alleviate the worry that EMH is based upon a coupling-constitution fallacy. We are repeatedly told how second-wave EMH would be a dramatic departure from our current perspective and would have radical new consequences for our conception of mentality, language systems, reasoning, etc. On that we can all agree. But we are told much less about why such a dramatic departure is a good idea, or just what the explanatory pay-off would be.

What these authors need, but do not really provide, is an argument for treating external structures as not only important for (and integrated with) cognitive systems during various cognitive tasks -- something Adams and Aizawa are happy to concede -- but for also treating them as actually mental states. Why, for example, should the actor's stage artifacts and props be treated as elements of an expanded cognitive system, instead of as, more conventionally, non-cognitive mnemonic tools that aid the actor's memory? Sutton doesn't really tell us. Menary offers the proposal that external elements are not mere tools because biological minds act upon them and vice versa -- that they are reciprocally integrated with one another. But that is hardly a convincing justification for thinking something is part of something else (when chopping wood, I am reciprocally integrated with an ax, but that doesn't make the ax part of me). At least with first-wave EMH and the parity principle, there was an intuitive response to the coupling-constitution criticism: outer elements are not mere tools because, in certain circumstances, there is no relevant difference in their functional role and the role of internal elements; hence, treating their location as relevant is a mere prejudice. But with second-wave EMH and its abandonment of the parity principle, a key justification for not regarding external structures as non-systemic aids is lost. In large measure, the essays supporting second-wave EMH in this volume do not answer the coupling-constitution fallacy so much as they simply ignore it.

How could one show that something is a real part of a system, as opposed to merely being causally integrated with it? What sort of distinction is this? Is it objectively real, or is it instead some sort of construct? It is unfortunate that these types of meta-questions don't receive further attention here. Moreover, it is surprising that none of the authors offer either a defense or critique of EMH that appeals to a broader analysis of systems. After all, there are lots of biological systems associated with our selves that are equally plausible candidates for extension. Is an asthmatic's inhaler part of her respiratory system or merely an aid to it? How should one try to answer such a question and what counts as getting it right? Consider what the parity principle might look like applied to our digestion system:

If, as we confront some task, a part of the world functions as a process which, were it done in our gut, we would have no hesitation in recognizing as part of the digestive process, then that part of the world is … part of the digestive process.

Suppose our evolutionary history had been quite different and we had evolved blenders as part of our biological digestive tract. It seems clear that if blending was part of our natural digestive process, we would have no hesitation in recognizing biological blending as part of our digestive system. But that counterfactual truth in no way tempts me to think that the blender on my kitchen counter should now count as part of my digestive system. Why should cognition be treated any differently? Many of the debates that take center stage in this volume lead to no clear resolution in part because basic questions like these are not properly addressed.

Nearly all of the essays discussed so far focus upon the intentional aspect of cognition -- on representational states like memories and beliefs. The phenomenal aspect of the mind has received much less attention in the EMH literature, and in their original essay Clark and Chalmers were careful to avoid claiming that consciousness itself might be located beyond the skull. But two of the most intriguing essays in this collection do not shy away from that proposal.

In her lengthy and complicated contribution, Susan Hurley offers a framework for EMH that distinguishes "What" from "How" externalism, and "Content" from "Quality" externalism. This taxonomy helps her to expose an important and interesting paradox that is the focal point of her essay. Given that there is a large intuitive gap between our understanding of brains and qualitative experience (where we can't really see how the former can instantiate the latter), then why is there such a strong intuition that qualitative experience must be entirely realized by what is inside the skull? As she puts it: "if we have so little understanding of how phenomenal qualities could possibly be explained, why are we so confident that if they can be, the explanation must be internalist?" (p. 145). Hurley offers a diagnosis of this paradox that aims to make externalism toward phenomenal states more palatable. By focusing on perceptual examples where external factors determine the classification of specific qualitative properties (where neural correlates of specific qualia can vary), Hurley argues that external factors are essential to explaining the 'what-it's-likeness' of perceptual states. While this was perhaps the most demanding chapter in the collection, there is much here that makes the effort worthwhile.

Mark Rowlands' careful yet somewhat cryptic essay also promotes the view that conscious experience is at least partially realized in elements that extend beyond the nervous system. Rowlands notes that while standard accounts of phenomenal experience appeal to modes of presentation, they overlook that such a mode has a dual role -- as an object of apprehension, but also as a vehicle or "enabler" of that experience (much like Frege's dual-role notion of sense). To clarify his position, Rowlands invokes Merleau-Ponty's example of a blind man using a cane. Much of the time, the cane itself is not an object of perception -- it is instead a "vehicle" of perceptual experience used to detect objects, as a conduit of the blind's man's phenomenal experience of the world. In similar fashion, Rowlands suggests that saccadic eye scans, "attention-grabbing" mechanisms, and spatial patterns of light also serve as vehicles by which the world is revealed. While Rowland's suggestions are intriguing, his arguments for thinking either that modes of presentations can serve as unapprehended vehicles of conscious experience or that they can be instantiated by things like saccadic eye movements are far from clear.

Finally, undoubtedly the oddest chapter is this volume is one that inadvertently suggests that the whole topic is deeply ill-conceived. In a somewhat condescending tone, Don Ross and James Ladyman tell us that that the coupling-constitution fallacy is based upon a naive and flawed conception of reality, since, at the level of fundamental physics, conventional notions like causation and constitution have no real application. Curiously, they see this as only a problem for the critics of EMH. Given that EMH itself depends on the idea that certain things are parts of other things (minds), their conclusion should have been that EMH is itself a confused non-issue (presumably, their essay isn't "part of" a volume devoted to such a non-issue). Perhaps the real take-home lesson from this chapter is something most of us already believed; namely, that whatever bizarre things physicists tell us about fundamental particles, their statements should have very little bearing on what we think about middle-sized things like cognitive systems.

Beyond these concerns about the individual chapters, it should be noted that there is no discernible organizational scheme behind the ordering of the essays. While the topics may not lend themselves to any obvious sequence, it would have helped if the editor had used the introduction to explain why he adopted the arrangement he did.

Yet despite this and the other concerns mentioned above, this collection is hardly a flop. Quite the contrary, it is easily the most broad-themed and diverse book on the topic of extended cognition. Indeed, one of its greatest virtues may be that it presents so many of the different ways people think about EMH. Insofar as some of those ways have problems that have not yet been addressed, it is enormously beneficial to have these brought to light. Menary's collection does enhance our understanding of extended minds and will thus significantly advance the discussion, though perhaps in ways that were not directly intended.


Rupert, Robert (2004): "Challenges to the Hypothesis of Extended Cognition." Journal of Philosophy, 101(8), 389-428.

[1] While some authors draw a sharp distinction between cognitive systems and minds, Clark and Chalmers make it clear that EMH is intended to apply to both. Since the authors in this volume treat the two as (more or less) the same thing, I will do so as well.