The External World and Our Knowledge of It: Hume's Critical Realism, an Exposition and Defence

Placeholder book cover

Fred Wilson, The External World and Our Knowledge of It: Hume's Critical Realism, an Exposition and Defence, U. of Toronto Press, 2008, 809pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780802097644.

Reviewed by Kevin Meeker, University of South Alabama



This massive tome is the final installment in a trilogy that Wilson has published on David Hume’s philosophy, particularly his metaphysics and epistemology. Looking at the big picture, Wilson argues that Hume “attempts … to offer a rational defence of naturalism and natural science” (p. 689). More specifically, he argues that Hume’s version of naturalism commits him to a critical realism “which at once in affirming the validity of the scientific picture of the world denies the validity of our ordinary perceptual experience and yet also rationally locates the world of common sense within the world of science” (p. 690). Finding a rational basis for science and common sense in Hume throws up a major roadblock to those skeptical interpreters who speed through Hume’s text and neglect to give it “the careful reading that it deserves” (p. 690). In what follows I shall offer a summary of the book and discuss some of its strengths and weaknesses.

The book comprises eight chapters. In the first Wilson argues that Hume’s view that thought is essentially linguistic is a “thorough-going naturalistic account” amountinf to “a radical break with the whole philosophical tradition that preceded him” (p. 86, p. 88). Because thought is inextricably tied to the social phenomenon of language, Wilson contends that we need to understand how linguistic conventions along with the mechanism of sympathy work in order to provide normative bite for Hume’s account of justice and morality (p. 42). We then have the resources necessary to extend this naturalistic understanding of normativity to Hume’s epistemology. Chapter Two reaches back to Plato and discusses the long history of the substance tradition in metaphysics, linking it with the epistemological view that knowledge is scientia, a kind of absolute certainty that serves as the “Cartesian standard”. Although Wilson credits Berkeley with being “the first to propose [an] alternative to the traditional substance-accident account”, it is left to Hume to offer a nonsubstantival account of the knower and thus eliminate substances completely from his ontology (p. 183). Because (according to Wilson) scientia fails along with substance ontology, the third chapter explains how Hume also provides a fallibilistic account of geometry, the traditional paradigm for infallible knowledge.

The fourth chapter builds to some extent on Wilson’s 1997 Hume’s Defence of Causal Inference. Wilson argues that, for Hume, "because one must make causal inferences, it is only reasonable or proper that one do so, fallible though those inferences may be" (pp. 309-310; Wilson’s emphasis). Of course, the fact that we must make causal inferences does not tell us which causal inferences we should make; after all, some causal inferences are good and some are bad. Assuming that we are curious and want the truth, Wilson argues that we should turn to Hume’s A Treatise of Human Nature and follow the standards set out in “Rules by which to judge of causes and effects” (Treatise Book I, Part iii, Section 15; Wilson pp. 319-321). These rules comprise the scientific method, upon which reasonable and epistemically responsible people rely. The fifth chapter further explores the notion of the reasonable and responsible knower in the context of Hume’s views on testimony. Chapter Six advances the controversial claim that for Hume "what counts as knowledge is justified true belief" (p. 375, Wilson’s emphasis; cf. p. 520, p. 682). This attribution opens up the door for Wilson to discuss contemporary issues surrounding Gettier problems, reliabilism, and coherentism as they relate to Hume’s epistemology. Reading Hume as advocating some kind of amalgamated reliabilist/coherentist account of justification also allows Wilson to argue in the penultimate seventh chapter that we should group Hume with G.E. Moore and Thomas Reid as a defender of common sense. The final chapter elaborates on the critical realist reading of Hume that puts him in the company of Roy Wood Sellars and the logical atomist phase of Bertrand Russell. According to Wilson, we can characterize critical realism in terms of eight propositions, of which I mention two here (propositions 4 and 7 on the list):

4 ‘Physical’ things exist ontologically and causally independently of being known … 7 They stand in such causal relations to our perceptions that it is possible for science to investigate some of these relations and some of the relations among physical things, and thus to gain trustworthy knowledge concerning laws of their action (pp. 545-546).

Relying mostly on “Of scepticism with regard to the senses” (Treatise I.iv.2), Wilson argues that Hume affirms the eight propositions. To put this critical realist point in more Humean language, he counts the systems of the philosophers and the vulgar as rationally justified (p. 616). In short, according to Wilson, Hume is not a radical sceptic who denies that all of our beliefs lack any kind of rational justification but a defender of the rationality of science and common sense.

This book displays many strengths. A major one is the way Wilson treats Hume not as a mere historical relic but as a partner in the philosophical enterprise. As the title suggests, he is interested in defending a Humean position using whatever contemporary means that are at his disposal. Here is one passage that makes this strategy explicit:

In terms of the history of logic, it is perfectly understandable, and excusable, that Hume suffered from many of the limitations one finds in him. And since excusable, there is no reason why one should not use those more modern advances to achieve a sympathetic reading, one that is more consistent with Hume’s own intentions (p. 579).

Although Wilson frequently sticks up for Hume in this way, he does not adopt a philosophical position just because Hume did. He is not afraid to claim that, say, Reid is correct and Hume is wrong on some philosophical issues (p. 490). Wilson makes many points about Hume interpretation that deserve a hearing. For example, his emphasis on understanding the overall religious context of Hume’s general philosophy seems well-placed (though I’m not sure that he is correct when he claims that “Commentators often studiously avoid … the Humean attack on religion” [p. 16]). Moreover, calling Hume’s view “Berkeleyan realism” highlights how indebted Hume is to his Irish predecessor in so many ways (e.g., p. 537). There is much food for thought here.

Before turning to what I take to be some weaknesses with the book, let me first describe its tone. Although this is a book about Hume, Wilson’s remarks are frequently Hobbesian: nasty, brutish, and short. He is often disdainfully dismissive of recent commentators, whole research programs in philosophy, and even famous historical figures. (Kant receives several particularly brutal broadsides with Wilson twice approvingly repeating Russell’s branding of Kant as the worst/greatest disaster to hit philosophy [p. 712, note 216; p. 738, note 61].) Some might find these dismissals amusing; others will find them annoying. Whether you chortle at or choke on his comments, you cannot accuse Wilson of cloaking his philosophical predilections.

Now for the problems. Unfortunately, the book is sprawling, laden with extraneous discussions and plagued with too many errors, typos, and misleading or unclear claims. Of course, most of us are guilty of digressions and mistakes, but this book exceeds the usual amount. The sprawling nature of the book is somewhat understandable given that Wilson wants not only to interpret and defend Hume, but also to right numerous historical wrongs:

I will not hesitate to refer to non-Humean discussions from scattered points in the history of philosophy if I think such an analysis will help in the exposition and defence of Hume. Nor is it just the illumination of Hume that I hope to achieve; I also hope to give some credit to historical antecedents that have, unfortunately, disappeared into the past (p. 7).

Attempting to bring together so many “scattered” points will probably elicit narrative vertigo in many readers. More generally, the length of the book provides ample opportunity for meanderings over a broad range of issues and some may decide in frustration that the dialectical labyrinth is not worth trying to navigate.

Several of these weaknesses crop up in Wilson’s discussion of Hume and Gettier cases. I presume that most are somewhat familiar with Gettier’s original famous counterexamples to the justified true belief analysis of knowledge. Wilson explains the example in which Smith infers, among other propositions, the true proposition that (a) either Jones owns a Ford, or Brown is in Barcelona (with Wilson mysteriously Canadianizing Brown’s location to Peggy’s Cove) from the false but justifiably believed proposition that (b) Jones owns a Ford. Although Smith justifiably believes the true proposition (a), Smith does not know (a). In the course of Wilson’s explanation, he includes a truth table for the logical inference of Addition (p. 377). Because only professional philosophers, mostly Hume scholars, are going to wade into this book, it is perplexing in the extreme why space is devoted to belaboring a point a professional philosophical reader should already understand. And if some intrepid reader is unfamiliar with truth tables, Wilson’s will not help because it has one of those all-too-frequent typos in the truth table!

More substantively, much of Wilson’s discussion of Gettier cases is unclear and misleading. Wilson correctly notes that Russell proposed a Gettier-like example before Gettier: the person who happens to look at a stopped clock the moment that it corresponds to the correct time clearly lacks knowledge. But then he offers the following assessment of the general debate:

Oddly, Gettier makes no reference to Russell’s earlier and more perspicuous argument. The puzzle that Gettier presents was in fact dissolved/resolved by Russell. A lot of ink was spilled in response to Gettier’s example; it might have been saved had Russell’s work been known or acknowledged. Those who don’t know their history are condemned to repeat it (p. 743, note 10).

While Russell’s stopped clock example is not mentioned in much of the Gettier literature, it is discussed by some contemporary epistemologists. None of them, though, seem to have found the resolution of which Wilson speaks. So would Wilson claim that even those who know their history are still condemned to repeat it?

In any event, it is not clear to me, after several re-readings of the section, exactly how Wilson thinks that this issue should be (or has been) dissolved. Here is the general idea: “with the distinction between objective justification and subjective justification, much of the paradox of the Russell and Gettier counterexamples to knowledge as justified true belief disappears” (p. 383). Unfortunately the details seem sketchy at best. As far as I can tell a person is subjectively justified, roughly, when one “is justified according to the information [one] has available” and objectively justified when “the fact known somehow guarantees the knowing of it” (p. 381, p. 384). These notions seem too vague to resolve the Gettier problem, or to make much of the Gettier paradox “disappear”. To be fair, Wilson approvingly appeals to Peter Unger’s non-accidental analysis of knowledge and Alvin Goldman’s major reliabilist “response” to Gettier as ways to understand the nature of objective justification (though Wilson did not make it clear exactly why he refers to Goldman’s reliabilism as a response to Gettier) (p. 383, p. 384). But then why does Wilson write that the results of the “boring” Gettier cottage industry “are not worth surveying” if he relies so heavily on at least some of those results to explain the distinction that he views as vital (p. 378)? The overall point I think that Wilson is trying to make is that Hume requires subjective and objective justification for knowledge. I suspect that one could arrive at that historical/interpretive point by way of a much less circuitous route. Moreover, if Wilson really wants to save ink by keeping us from further futile researches, it would be nice for him to publish a paper in a journal widely read by epistemologists that would explain exactly how we can dissolve/resolve the Gettier problem.

Generally speaking, discussing contemporary epistemological issues does not seem to be Wilson’s forte. But he slips up even on his home turf of Hume studies. For example, he appears to provide a misleading description of the lay of the interpretive land. The book begins by claiming that Hume is usually seen as a sceptic. In Wilson’s own words: “Hume is a sceptic. He uses reason to attack reason, and finds that reasoning wanting: there are no good reasons at all for any of our beliefs. That, at least, is the standard picture of Hume” (p. 3). These statements are not only featured prominently on back of the book jacket, but also reinforced elsewhere in the book: “We are arguing that Hume is not a sceptic with regard to our knowledge of the external world. This is no doubt odd to many: it is hardly the traditional view of Hume” (p. 13). Granted, many commentators in the past, and non-specialists today, view Hume as a skeptic. Nevertheless, for the past few decades the vast majority of Hume commentators have read him as a naturalist and not a radical skeptic, so the naturalists now dominate. As Ira Singer put it in an article from 2000: “The interpretation of Hume as a constructive naturalist throughout his work, even where he seems at his most skeptical, dates back to the work of Norman Kemp Smith, and is deeply in vogue again” (“Nature Breaks Down”, Hume Studies 26: 227). Wilson’s ignoring of the recent naturalist trend makes his own critical realist version sound more original than it really is; it is yet another garden variety of the naturalistic Humes. That of course does not mean that Wilson’s interpretation is incorrect, but it does give him an illusory rhetorical advantage. It is easier to attack a view radically at odds with your own than to separate yourself from views that have many similarities. When it comes to debates among naturalists about Hume interpretation, we often encounter cryptic debates about whose Hume is more naturalistic or scientific. Despite Wilson’s mischaracterization of the interpretive debate, even he gets drawn into these more-scientific-than-thou debates when, for instance, in discussing Hume and philosophy of mind he finds it necessary to argue that, in some senses, "the behaviorists were and are far more scientific in their aims than the cognitive scientists" (p. 125; Wilson’s emphasis).

Before closing, let me make two comments about the specifics of his Hume interpretation. Wilson takes as his controlling interpretive authority the famous concluding paragraph of Hume’s An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding:

When we run over libraries, persuaded of these principles, what havoc must we make? If we take in our hand any volume; of divinity or school metaphysics, for instance; let us ask, Does it contain any abstract reasoning concerning quantity or number? No. Does it contain any experimental reasoning concerning matter of fact and existence? No. Commit it then to the flames: for it can contain nothing but sophistry and illusion.

Wilson takes this as a decisive text supporting his position, providing the following gloss: “Hume makes it perfectly clear that his aim is not a general scepticism. Neither is it a scepticism from which he is saved not by reason but by nature” (p. 13). Wilson elaborates:

The clear message: he is separating religion and school metaphysics on the one hand from commonsense and science on the other: the upshot of the argument, we are meant clearly to infer, is that the former is, from the standpoint of reason, worthless, and that the latter alone is of value (pp. 13-14; cf. p. 20, p. 681).

Despite Wilson’s claim, this passage is far from perfectly clear, at least in the way that he suggests. It makes no mention of commonsense or what the standpoint of reason might be, for example. And what, precisely, are the principles to which Hume refers at the beginning of the paragraph? Presumably Wilson would point to the rules by which to judge of causes and effects, but dealing with all of the issues raised in that other context is extremely complicated. At the very least, we need to go beyond this paragraph to determine the nature of these principles before we can claim to have found any clear meaning here. Moreover, Wilson himself at one point admits that “Hume’s bantering tone has a tendency to mislead”, so is it possible that Hume’s obvious rhetorical flourishes here might obscure his meaning (p. 593)? These questions and considerations do not invalidate Wilson’s reading, but they should underscore the precariousness of making this single passage a clear textual authority for all things Humean. The majority who interpret Hume as a naturalist already agree with the general tenor of Wilson’s reading and thus will probably not flinch much at Wilson’s reading of this passage. Those not already on board will need more convincing.

Also in need of more support is Wilson’s major controversial claim that Hume postulates something like a justified true belief account of knowledge. After all, when Hume most explicitly discusses knowledge in the Treatise, it seems to be restricted to relations of ideas (I.iii.1) . Strangely, when Wilson explicitly attributes this more modern view to Hume (p. 375), it is followed up by a quotation from John Locke. Either the textual evidence from Hume’s text for this claim is missing or I somehow overlooked it. As someone who would like to be convinced that Hume held a justified true belief view of knowledge, I was disappointed that I could not find more evidence.

The problems to which I have pointed do not show that Wilson’s reading of Hume is false. Although more work needs to be done to defend this critical realism reading, in general Wilson has developed it to the extent that it is a naturalistic alternative worthy of consideration in the pantheon of Hume interpretations.