The Extraordinary in the Ordinary: The Aesthetics of Everyday Life

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Thomas Leddy, The Extraordinary in the Ordinary: The Aesthetics of Everyday Life, Broadview Press, 2012, 288pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781551114781.

Reviewed by Christopher Dowling, University of York


Discussion of everyday aesthetics has been gaining momentum in recent years, and as well as developing his own theory of everyday aesthetics and of aesthetic experience more broadly construed,Leddy has produced an invaluable reflective consolidation of the work of major contributors to the discipline, past and present. The text is divided into two parts.  The first (Chapters 1-3) identifies the domain of everyday aesthetics in relation to the more well established domains of art- and nature-aesthetics; the second (Chapters 4-8) reveals and explores the author's own theoretical contribution to this domain. I will start by outlining Leddy's own conception of aesthetic experience (the majority of which is presented in Chapter 4) before engaging with two particularly prominent and intriguing aspects of his approach to everyday aesthetics.

Leddy's thesis: Aesthetic experience as experience of objects with 'aura'

Leddy's approach to everyday aesthetics is tempered by an understanding that the term 'aesthetic' (along with cognate predicates including 'beauty', and 'sublime') has a cultural, ever-evolving, meaning and by the view that we are currently progressing through a period of expansion of this concept (202-3). In particular, he aims to expand (and unify) the field of aesthetic properties to avoid limiting the aesthetic to experiences of art (or, more recently, art and nature) and in order to draw attention to those aesthetic qualities that tend to have been (largely) neglected in contemporary discussion.

In order to meet these objectives, and to provide a means for distinguishing between aesthetic and non-aesthetic uses of terminology, Leddy develops his central conception of 'aura', asserting that 'an aesthetic property is one in which the aesthetic object takes on "aura" within experience' (128). This notion of 'aura' is construed as a phenomenological characteristic of the object-as-experienced -- an almost inexplicable mixture of significance and pleasure (244).[1] Thus 'aura' is an aspect of the intentional object of any experience characterised as aesthetic.[2] Aura is not a property in and of itself -- not a detachable part of the thing-as-experienced -- but a kind of intensified or peculiarly vivid experience of the thing or its qualities (135). In consequence, all instances of applying aesthetic predicates are, in Leddy's view, instances of describing some experience of 'aura'. This is perhaps more evident with some predicates rather than others (predicates such as 'shimmer', 'sparkle', 'shine', 'gleam'), but on this view an entire continuum of aesthetic experiences (running from low-level aesthetic experience to the experience of beauty and beyond) ischaracterisable in terms of the degree of aura involved.

There must also be a reflective or contemplative element to one's experience of aura for it to count as aesthetic. To help consolidate these ideas let us consider one of Leddy's examples in which hedescribes noticing the beautiful effect of the shadows cast by some trees. Contemplating this effect, Leddy remarks, "the shadows seem to belong to another world. That is, looking at the shadows as the branches themselves wave in the wind is as though one were looking into an alternative reality" (130). These shadows (viewed more like contemporary artworks) have an 'aura' in Leddy'sexperience of them. This involves (or can be characterised in terms of) two components: firstly there is a kind of distancing -- 'they cannot be touched or changed in themselves, but only by way of touching or changing the trees that cast them' (ibid). Secondly, the experience invokes metaphors of 'glowing' or 'going beyond itself' in the sense of appearing vividly extraordinary. Such ideas recall Proust's famous 'madeleine moment' (an example discussed in Chapter 8), but also suggest an affinity with Kant's notion (in the context of art) of 'aesthetic ideas'[3] or Yuriko Saito's discussion of the Japanese craftsmen who are able to perfectly exemplify 'the quintessential character of, for example, a tea cup' (116-7). Such examples help to communicate and exemplify this notion of something's being experienced as having the quality or character of 'aura'; a heightened significance in which the item experienced seems to extend beyond itself, gesturing to another world.

Artists are especially practiced at the apprehension of 'aura', as, perhaps, are those aesthetes who seek to see the world with the eyes of the artist. In both the experience of the artist and of the artist-like perceiver, what is important, aesthetically, is this way in which the ordinary can be made extraordinary. In this sense Leddy explains that artists are the true experts in everyday aesthetics (121). Thankfully, the rest of us may become more aware of such experiences via the mediation of art.

While no doubt elusive in various respects, this opening characterization of the core of Leddy's position also serves to identify two features of his approach that deserve further consideration. The first is his eclecticism; the second is the prominence he gives to the aesthetics of art in his discussion of the everyday. I will critically engage with each of these two aspects below, before consolidating my discussion with a closing review of the peculiar values The Extraordinary in the Ordinary has to offer.

Eclecticism and anti-analytic aesthetics

Leddy's approach is self-confessedly 'eclectic' (12). By considering potential counterexamples to the characterisations of aesthetic experience developed by (e.g.) Plato, Hume, Kant, Hegel, Dewey, Beardsley, Sartwell, Berleant, Carlson, Saito, and others, Leddy shows that while contributing significantly to the field, none of these approaches is quite able to accommodate the (often neglected) aesthetic potentialities of the everyday. He does, however, acknowledge and incorporate the occasional gems that such positions have to offer.

This approach will not be to everybody's taste and, just as the eclecticism of the nineteenth century was deemed to be inferior by Modernists, some may find Leddy's overall strategy to be lacking a kind of coherence or neatness (to borrow one of Leddy's more neglected 'surface aesthetic properties'). While acknowledging that 'What most readers will be looking for is some sort of glue that holds the field together' (91), he doubts that such a 'glue' will be forthcoming. Still, I will suggest that Leddy's own doubts are, to an extent, disingenuous. The real 'glue' (as with any valuable eclecticism) comes from the curator's choice of contrasts, experiences, and insights, and from the more general inferences that the reader is expected to draw from Leddy's discussion.

As mentioned above, one such inference is a commitment to a rich continuum of aesthetic experiences. Leddy's eclecticism generates a fairly broad characterisation of aesthetic experience encompassing both 'low-level' or 'background' aesthetic experiences -- expressible via predicates such as "clean", "well-ordered", "good-looking", "pleasant" -- together with the more extra-ordinary, intense, and complex experiences -- often expressible via the same predicates as the first class but with the addition of terms such as "very", "strikingly", "remarkably" and so on. Elsewhere, Leddy mediates this continuum by reference to what he calls the 'major league' aesthetic concepts (harmony, balance, beauty, the sublime) and the 'minor league' concepts (neatness and messiness), conceding that in some contexts the latter may more properly be referred to in terms of 'pre-aesthetic' or 'proto-aesthetic' qualities (204).

The influence of John Dewey's Art as Experience also emerges as a unifying feature in The Extraordinary in the Ordinary. Leddy rejects Dewey's characterisation of aesthetic experience solely in terms of 'an experience' (58) -- this alone he takes to be too narrow to delimit the field of everyday aesthetics (90). But Leddy embraces many of those features of Dewey's approach that he takes to have been neglected in contemporary analytic aesthetics. Both Dewey's emphasis on the 'live creature interacting with its environment' (77), and, in particular, his identification of the dialectical relationship between fine art and ordinary experience reveal the background against which Leddy's own theory can emerge.

Despite the academic neglect Dewey's work during the analytic revolution in aesthetics from the 1950s onwards, this influence from Dewey places Leddy in good company and some familiarity with Dewey's work is likely to enrich one's engagement with Leddy's text and with this area of aesthetics.[4] Still, just as Dewey's method is often disconcerting to students of analytic philosophy, one may initially find Leddy's approach similarly off-putting. Leddy's familiarity with Dewey enables him to both anticipate and (to an extent) respond to many of the perceived shortcomings of Dewey's work.[5] As I've mentioned, Leddy's discussion is far more prone to clear argument and critical engagement with the works of other scholars, taking a strong interest in the history of aesthetics. Still, some readers will no doubt find his appeals to broad characterisations and his use of metaphor intended to limit (but not entirely eradicate) misinterpretation occasionally frustrating.

An awareness of the neglect of Dewey's work will help to situate Leddy's anti-analytic inclinations (and to minimize the frustrations mentioned above). As he recognises, 'analysis is pretty much defined by the making of distinctions' (84), an approach which he suggests has the tendency to generate a 'blind spot' for analytic philosophers that often leads them to regard as 'muddy' the thinking of those (such as Dewey) whose positions challenge or evade capture in accordance with certain widely accepted distinctions. Once again, illustration will help elucidate Leddy's resistance to such conclusions (and to identify some further 'blind spots' which Leddy sees as characteristic of analytic aesthetics), but I will do so by introducing the second main feature of his approach that I wish to emphasise.

Art- and Artist-centred aesthetics: A dialectical approach to the everyday

Saito has recently appealed to a distinction between art-centered and non-art centered approaches to everyday aesthetics according to which the former take art and its appreciation as core to our aesthetic life, and tend to focus on how art objects and their experiences differ from other objects and experiences.[6] Leddy's position evades easy capture under this distinction. He concedes that it may not be possible to approach 'the ordinariness of the ordinary without making it extraordinary, without approaching it, therefore, in an art-like way' (121). He also appeals to the aesthetics of art by way of Hegel (who developed an expressly art-centered aesthetics). But in doing so his aim is always to draw from, rather than be constrained by, the theoretical framework under consideration.

From Hegel's art-centered aesthetics we gain the insight that artists are able to capture and highlight many temporary features of everyday life -- a momentary glance, a fleeting ray of light -- that deserve our attention (34). We also recognise the artist's capacity to transcend the commonplace -- rendering the ordinary extraordinary -- via the dialectical relationship between art and the everyday that Dewey emphasised. As a central theme in Leddy's approach, this dialectical relationship deserves further (albeit brief) attention.

By emphasising the artistic creative process (often neglected in analytic aesthetics) Leddy identifies what he sees to be a continuity between art and everyday life according to which the transformation of everyday experience is itself part of the nature or art. This dialectical relationship is, he thinks, most prominent in the artist's studio or in the moments at which the artist draws inspiration from the world:

Imagine what it was like for Cézanne to paint a tree. He sees the tree, even initially, in a way that is radically different from that of non-artists (and also radically different from the more conventional realist artists of his time). He then goes on to transform his experience of it, both during contemplative moments prior to putting paint to canvas, and in reflective looking during the process of painting. The experience of the painting as it emerges in the creative process becomes part of the experience of the tree, and the experience of the tree part of the experience of the painting, the two mixed up in ways that would be hard to disentwine. (79-80).

By focussing on the transfiguration itself, the 'blind-spots' of Arthur Danto's famous approach (1981) are revealed. We see how he failed to recognise both the everyday aesthetic experiences that serve as precursors to artistic activity and inspiration, and also the subsequent impact such works can have on one's experience of the everyday. While such attention to the everyday is surely more appreciable with respect to certain art forms (Leddy particularly emphasises the Surrealists and art-photography, as well as works such as Warhol's Brillo Boxes), such claims are not restricted to realist or representational art. We see trees differently after attending a show of Monet's paintings (86), but this idea can be generalized to accommodate other art forms (99).

While analytically evasive, and clearly not 'art-centered' given this dialectical characteristicperhaps it would not be inappropriate to describe Leddy's approach as 'artist-centered' given his emphasis on the expertise of both artists and those who see the world through the eyes of the artist. Leddy's approach purports to be democratic -- we all have both access and insight concerning the extraordinary in the ordinary -- and, in closing, he defends this characterization by pointing out that everyday life is not the sole domain of experts (261). These comments seem to be in conflict with his earlier claim that 'artists are the true experts in the aesthetics of everyday life' (121). Perhaps you don't have to be interested in art to be interested in everyday aesthetics, but it helps! Still, it is of interest to note that Leddy's championing of everyday aesthetic experience does not entail that art galleries should lose any custom. This is a significant consequence of the importance that Leddyaccords to art and to artists in opening our eyes to the 'aura' of the everyday.

The value of Leddy's approach

In the course of discussion Leddy distinguishes his own account of aesthetic experience in terms of 'aura' from familiar theories of the aesthetic (from Beardsley, Levinson, Carroll and Iseminger), suggesting that his own position -- while related to such views[7] -- is able to overcome a number of disadvantages involved in these alternatives. Some of the moves here deserve careful consideration, not least because Leddy's own judgements and intuitions will appear (at times) controversial.[8] In particular, Leddy's aura-theory and his intended expansion of the class of aesthetic properties required for his conception of everyday aesthetics comes into conflict with the (standard) analytic aesthetician's sympathy for some form of aesthetic supervenience.[9] Leddy argues that such dependence theories[10] are misleading and that Sibley's contention that there is a clear distinction between aesthetic qualities and the non-aesthetic qualities on which these depend must be rejected (144-8).

Also of note is Leddy's pluralist approach to aesthetic predication and evaluation (Chapter 6). Again as a consequence of his eclecticism, Leddy holds that each of the major aesthetic theories he considers have some (but none a complete) scope of application for the full range of everyday aesthetic phenomena; some theories being more appropriate to particular ranges of objects or phenomena than others. In relation to art, nature, and the everyday it may sometimes be appropriate for aesthetic evaluations to be grounded in innate tendencies to appreciate (the Pythagorean notions of) order and harmony. Whereas, there are some areas of aesthetic interest in which we should be willing to defer to a connoisseur, thus invoking the appropriateness of a more deferentialHumean 'competent judges' approach. The list is left open-ended, including appeals to the functionalist approach characteristic of Parsons and Carlson's recent work (2008), Kant's 'disinterested' approach and the Japanese concept of (heart-felt) yûgen; Leddy also alludes to the possible appropriateness of appeals to those theories derived from Beardsley, Heidegger, and others with respect to some restricted range of objects or phenomena (194; 207).

Over all, Leddy is of the view that his approach succeeds in capturing something 'new and valuable' (203), but at times his expression of the nature of this value can be somewhat elusive; not least because in general Leddy considers himself to be 'interested in elucidating the nature of aesthetic experience, not the value of any type of aesthetic experience' (200, emphasis added). Contemplation of the extraordinary in the ordinary can presumably yield more pleasure (as any aesthetic experience must), but given Leddy's recognition of the potential dangers of such pursuits (215-6), together with the apparent scope for making inferential mistakes (197), this doesn't automatically evoke ascriptions of value but suggests the need for a more piecemeal approach.

The Ordinary in the Extraordinary is a personal account of Leddy's own perspective on everyday aesthetics. His own interests in photography and photographic art exert some influence during many of his critical discussions; he also cites the influence of his wife, Karen Haas, who, as a painter 'made [him] constantly aware of the role of the artist in our perception of everyday life' (8).Leddy's autobiographical examples of everyday appreciation and his critical perspectives on the full range of contributions to the aesthetics literature deserve careful consideration, but in the end his 'something new and valuable' is probably situated with the debates that might ensue from these proposals (see, e.g., 203), and the possibility for reflexivity that might arise from our encounter with his work. Indeed, Leddy describes himself as taking inspiration from Gadamer's 'fusion of horizons' approach,[11] which enables the reader to negotiate the differences between different prejudices (i.e., frameworks of understanding) together with her own experiences and independent influences.

Everyday aesthetic experience is clearly a prominent concern for Leddy, but this opportunity for reflexivity is encouraged by the fact that -- in contrast to some other contributions in this domain -- readers will not find this priority thrust upon them. As he admits, everyday aesthetics is a priority for him, but the aesthetics of nature may play a more prominent role for someone who lives in the wilds of Alaska (98). The result is a discussion that is not always persuasive (and perhaps not intended to be) but is always inviting. In particular, one is invited to reconsider the prominence (and potential shortcomings) of analytic approaches in this domain, to re-consider the richness and potential contributions accessible from those positions that have been overlooked in more recent years (e.g., Dewey) or overlooked in the discussion of everyday aesthetics (e.g., Hegel). Whether or not one is persuaded by Leddy's account, or attracted by his notion of aura, one should also appreciate the fresh perspective he offers on many of those texts (Walton's 'Categories of Art', Sibley's 'Aesthetic Concepts', Danto's Transfiguration of the Commonplace) and artworks (Warhol'sBrillo Box, Cage's 4'33'') that have become the bread-and-butter for students and scholars of contemporary aesthetics. For many readers this will be an academic terrain that has become wholly familiar and quotidian, yet Leddy demonstrates that it is still capable of yielding new and extraordinary insights.

Works Cited

Dewey, J. Art as Experience (New York: Putnam's Sons 1958 [1934]).

Danto, A. Transfiguration of the Commonplace (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1981).

Dowling, C. 'The Aesthetics of Daily Life', British Journal of Aesthetics 50:3 (2010), 226-42.

Eaton, M.M. 'The Intrinsic, Non-Supervenient Nature of Aesthetic Properties', Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 52:4 (1994) 383-406.

Gadamer, H. Truth and Method (New York: Continuum, 1989).

Iseminger, G. 'The Aesthetic State of Mind' in Kieran (ed.) Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art (Oxford: Blackwell, 2005) Chapter 6, 98-110.

Kant, I. Critique of Judgement trans. Meredith (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1952).

Leddy, T. 'Dewey's Aesthetics', Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Parsons, G. & Carlson, A. Functional Beauty (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2008).

Saito, Y. Everyday Aesthetics (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).

Sibley, F. 'Aesthetic Concepts' Philosophical Review 68 (1959), 421-50.

Walton, K. 'Categories of Art', Philosophical Review 79:3 (1970), 334-67.

Zangwill, N. The Metaphysics of Beauty (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2001).

[1] This approach is broadly Husserlian and thus distinguishable from other phenomenological approaches to aesthetic experience such as that developed by Gary Iseminger (2005).

[2] Not to be confused with the theosophist's metaphysical conception of 'aura', or the 'aura of authenticity' some readers may associate with Walter Benjamin.

[3] Kant, Critique of Judgement §49.

[4] A good place to start for those less familiar would be Leddy's Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy entry on Dewey:

[5] However, one significant (and frustrating) oversight concerns Leddy's referencing technique. It is of note that Dewey's Art as Experience lacked adequate footnotes in its original format. Similarly, while Leddy's text will be of interest to both students and scholars, those less familiar with the wider literature drawn upon and mediated will, I suspect, be occasionally frustrated by the absence of a full bibliography. Likewise, while much of the discussion in Part I is (appropriately) pitched at an introductory level, those wishing to explore and follow-up Leddy's erudite discussions may find it difficult to locate full references for the specific texts to which he alludes.

[6] Saito, 2007, 14-15; for an attempt at a related distinction see my 'The Aesthetics of Daily Life' (2010).

[7] In particular, the phenomenological aspect of Iseminger's approach and the interest in aesthetic properties characteristic of Carroll's enterprise.

[8] For example, when engaging with Carroll's position Leddy insists that 'An aesthetically negative experience is not an aesthetic experience' (2012, p. 140). Elsewhere, he asserts that Disney World could render a sublime experience (240) and allows (contra Beardsley) that aesthetic experiences can be afforded by taking LSD.

[9] Leddy joins Marcia Muelder Eaton (1994) in resisting this trend.

[10] From Frank Sibley's early account (1959) to more recent attempts to identify a broader conception of the base-properties on which aesthetic properties supervene (e.g., Zangwill (2001)).

[11] This is mentioned in passing at p. 105 and, for me, deserved to take a more prominent role in Leddy's articulation and defense of his approach to aesthetics.