The Extravagant: Crossings of Modern Poetry and Modern Philosophy

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Robert Baker, The Extravagant: Crossings of Modern Poetry and Modern Philosophy, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 424pp, $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 0268021821.

Reviewed by Donald G. Marshall, Pepperdine University


Romanticism is spilt religion, T. E. Hulme famously claimed. But the Enlightenment spilled it. Romantics weren't trying to put it back in the bottle. They accepted the Enlightenment critique of dogma and ecclesiastical institutions but had their own critique of rationalism's dismissal of spirit and spirituality. Out of the split between institutions and spirit arose symptomatic expressions like "religious sentiment," "religious experience," and indeed "religion" tout court, apart from the beliefs and practices of any actual community of faith. Romantic spirituality may seem to be nostalgia for a lost home, but this is deceptive. Ultimately, it is not oriented toward the past but functions as a critique of the world the Enlightenment made. Industrialization, technology, bureaucracy, instrumental rationality, materialism, the self reduced to a consumer, commodification, and so on and so on form the particulars in a bill of indictment against modernity and all its works. Escaping the iron cage of modernity demanded disrupting conventions and conventional language, plunging into experiences that carried the self beyond the narrow confines of everyday life, and releasing the creativity in destruction even up to the point of death.

The poets and philosophers who allied themselves in this struggle against modernity are the burden of Robert Baker's The Extravagant: Crossings of Modern Poetry and Modern Philosophy. By "extravagant," he points to a critique of the "boundaries of experience established by the dominant social, scientific, and philosophic frameworks of capitalist modernity" (2), but a critique ironically aware that it can offer no faith in or even representation of anything in whose name it wrestles to traverse or transform those boundaries. Its resources are hyperbole, metaphor, paradox, gnomic aphorisms, the evocation of strange states and extreme experiences, the adoption of masks -- a discourse that can neither explain nor justify itself in the language of daily life. Philosophers who join this struggle must unravel the seamless web of modern self-evidence, deconstruct the solid edifice of scientific argument, practice the guerilla tactics of the negative. It is no surprise that they turn to modern poets for the discursive resources and provocations to insight that they need.

Baker discerns three major traditions of the extravagant: "the experience of the sublime" in Kant, Wordsworth, and Jean-François Lyotard; "the Faustian quest for visionary metamorphosis" in Rimbaud, Nietzsche, and Georges Bataille; and "apocalyptic negativity" in Kierkegaard, Emily Dickinson, Mallarmé, and Jacques Derrida (35). What is most attractive in his readings of these philosophers and poets is that they are understood as equal participants in a common enterprise. The poets are not "translated" into the language of philosophy, as though their own words were an obscure anticipation of what finally gets clearly articulated in philosophical language. The philosophers do not always have the last word. The penultimate chapter titled "Conclusion" ends with a stanza from the Peruvian poet César Vallejo; and the "Epilogue" brings the book to a close with a discussion of the English poet Geoffrey Hill and the American poet George Oppen. One even comes to feel a certain sympathy for the philosophers -- even Kierkegaard or Nietzsche, let alone Bataille or Derrida -- who wrestle with prose to articulate more or less anemically what the poets express exactly with luminous eloquence. Not that the philosophers suffer from being brought on stage with the poets. On the contrary, the spirit and insights that animate them communicate themselves more clearly and tellingly than they would if Baker lost himself and his reader in the intricacies of the terms and arguments that, in Plato's phrase, are as weak as all logoi.

The resemblance between Baker's notion of the "extravagant" and the contemporary reflection on the "sublime" makes it fitting that he begin by taking up that tradition. The sublime brings together "a discourse of power" in the context of "insurgent individualism" (48). In the sublime, two forces are at play: the subject is unsettled by "an encounter with a forceful otherness"; but it then asserts its own inner powers that might have remained concealed but for the disruptive encounter (48). Kant claims for the moral subject a radical freedom from everything other -- heterogeneous -- even at the risk of solipsism. While the beautiful harmonizes the faculties, the sublime disrupts harmony, pointing toward the disruptions that are the staple of modern art. But from an initial sense of the subject's inadequacy, the sublime stirs a sense of the self's transcendent power, thus reinforcing its radical freedom, restrained only by the law it gives itself. Wordsworth engages the same tension between a self renewed by "harmoniously interactive powers" (56) and a self transported by its own creative powers beyond its localization within nature and society. Such transport echoes a Christian transcendent redemption that may be irrecuperable within a humanist secularism. Baker follows Geoffrey Hartman's description of a tension in Wordsworth between a quest for sublime freedom and a quest for relational bonds (64). Taking up these issues, Jean-François Lyotard shifted from conceiving the sublime in terms of the subject's inventive powers to conceiving it as the destitution of the subject. A "voice of kinetic revolt" yields to "a later voice of ruminative, if at times oracular, melancholy" (69). In Lyotard, the modernist revolt against representation is made to serve a conception of justice as resistance to the reduction of difference to the same. Baker's critique of this conception is convincing. It treats invention and innovation as goods in themselves, making an indeterminate otherness the ground of a rather desperate and anemic politics -- "a bohemian ethos of nomadic iconoclasm" (86). The "destitute" consciousness that disavows its own assertive or synthetic powers mirrors the functionalist subject created by instrumental reason and capitalist consumerism that Lyotard set out to critique. Baker does not hesitate to draw the larger lesson. Perhaps we have grown "frightened by our own moments of released power" and consequently recoded them "as an ethical discourse of messianic openness to the other" (89). But this seems to "confuse a language of sublime self-dispossession," rooted in the language of religious transcendence, "with the language of ethical relationship" (89).

Over the second tradition Baker traces presides the myth of Faust as a figure of creative self-transformation. In the writings of Rimbaud, Nietzsche, and Bataille, figures of constricted or mutilated life are set against figures of expansion, renovation, self-transcendence, creativity released through the destruction of every kind of blockage or limitation, boundless energy symbolized by the sun. Extravagant adventures of this kind run great risks -- of a loss of creative energy, of solipsism, of a "free fall of self-destruction" (95), or of a collision with the whole array of reality principles, natural and social. The reading of Rimbaud's corpus fills in this outline with a subtle attention to detail and a sensitive ear. In discussing Nietzsche, Baker argues that Thus Spoke Zarathustra recasts the conception of tragedy and tragic overcoming presented in The Birth of Tragedy. Art, for Nietzsche, transfigures the nihilist devaluation of life by communicating "a tragic yet joyous 'participation' in the destructive-creative energies of the Dionysian flux" (131). In Zarathustra Baker sees a "displaced individualist and apocalyptic Protestantism" (135), in which the release of the individual's creative power accomplishes a "renovative self-surpassing" (135). But this hoped-for release is interrupted by the idea of eternal return. Returning to the Birth of Tragedy, Baker interprets eternal return as a figure "for the destructive-creative play of a ceaseless Dionysian flux" (136). What Zarathustra must overcome is both a fear of death and a hostility toward his own contingent being in time. Overcoming nihilism demands both affirming and transforming the limitations set by the given. From this perspective, the Übermensch is "a whimsical renaming of the overreaching tragic hero" (146). Bataille's thinking is pulled between two poles. On the one side is a Hegelianizing Marxism that supplies "a totalizing account of rational social development" (152). By negating nature through purposive work, human beings create "an intersubjective realm of relative freedom" (153). But they then subject themselves to the very "second nature" they have created. From this subjection, art points the way toward ecstatic movements of release. The ultimate block in the path to release is the fear of death, and in attempting to revive in modern society a liberating release, Bataille does not shrink from conceiving "freedom as a decisive turning toward death" (154). Ultimately, however, this "lyricism of death" (155) leads not to the practical transformation of historical life but to a rapturous exit from it (161). The impulse "toward a rapturous religious freedom" (162) cannot finally be harnessed to a theory of social transformation. Baker rightly invokes the poet William Blake as a founding figure in this tradition and then tracks it through Marx to surrealism, closing with a glance at Maurice Blanchot.

Baker's third tradition undertakes a radical thinking of "the destructive and creative movement of temporal negativity" (176). By dissolving the possibility of foundations, temporal negativity releases subjectivity to the radical freedom of an immanent creative power and simultaneously frees language or signifying power from any ground or bounds. The result is a perpetual instability and open-endedness or openness to the absent. Under this scheme, Baker examines the work of Kierkegaard, Emily Dickinson, Mallarmé, and Derrida. He concedes the evident divergence among them, but that is just what gives his grouping its revelatory bite. The intensity of inwardness and the unrepresentability of the divine traverse Kierkegaard's writings. Baker brings out with great penetration the "mobility of a teaching by indirection" (180) that leads to the endless play of personas in Kierkegaard. Faith resolves this play by a negative hyperbole, "suffering the relationship in dis-relationship" of the finite to the infinite (194). Dickinson carries this drama a step further by "letting waver the bridge of faith itself" (195). She is poised between the tradition of Christian typology, a romantic celebration of imagination and psychic transport, and the "elliptical composition" through which modernity "evokes the strange errancy of language … as inherited grounds waver or collapse" (197). Her willingness to suffer this experience of "foundering" leads to Mallarmé's absorption into the patterning of words among themselves that culminates in a totalizing Book that the poet can realize only by surpassing himself in "a meditative sounding of death" (215). Mallarmé writes from within a tension between transfiguring chance and undergoing self-extinction in death, while refusing escape into dreams of transcendence. Derrida helps pull together the threads of the argument, since he has written on Mallarmé and Bataille (and more recently on Kierkegaard, though Baker does not discuss these texts). With Derrida, Heidegger's thinking of time as the horizon of Being is recentered on the errancy that inhabits even the most seemingly "secure order of representation within which the subject finds itself inscribed" (243). Against Foucault's picture of panoptic modernity as turning the screws ever tighter, Derrida insists that a screw is always coming loose (256). This is something we would very much like to believe, and so, for Baker, Derrida becomes, in his own words, "the last of the eschatologists" (256), looking for an exit somewhere. As Baker sees it, this myth of exodus opens to a myth of promise (messianism without Messiah) that remains even after the myth of foundation is abandoned. But both Jewish and Christian tradition, he suggests, might be characterized in this way -- as promise, rather than foundation.

In his account of each of these traditions, Baker stresses that each is motivated by its hostility to the iron cage of modernism. The only discourse capable of articulating a critique and an alternative is religious -- or we might as well speak the blunt truth and say "Christian." Yet the modern anti-moderns are in thrall (I am speaking for myself now, not Baker) to the secularism that is essential to modernity. As a result, the religious positions they re-occupy (Hans Blumenberg's term) become merely self-assertion (again, Blumenberg's term), without transcendent backing. As a result, they are fundamentally compromised. They cannot escape co-optation, precisely because they are products of the very modernity they imagine themselves as opposing. Though Baker presents these traditions with great force and sympathy, he cannot help observing periodically that errancy is not so much the antagonist of capitalism as its very essence (this is the nub of Fredric Jameson's critique of postmodernity). The liquidation of foundations, the emptying out of the self, the unmooring of language from representation -- what else did Marx mean when he said that with capitalism, "all that is solid melts into air"? What is striking is that, despite their severing from doctrine and the substantive practice of ecclesia, these displaced languages of transcendence retain an impressive prophetic power of critique. Unhappily, this merely intellectual insight leaves them powerless against, even in collusion with, the culture of death. Baker cannot but conclude that these traditions have "reached a certain end of the line, a far margin from which texts of evocative erasure and acrobatic dislocation are mailed to the world as though they were melancholy letters of desperate, thinned, exiled freedom" (299).

Where, then, do we go from here? Baker's epilogue is restrained but looks in a different direction. He mentions philosophers who have attempted to recover a "postmetaphysical Hegelian dialectic" (300). They are seeking a way to respond to "the weight of injustice and the fog of pointlessness" that "complexly condition one another in the modern world" (301). In accord with Baker's implicit message and explicit method throughout, he invites us (and these philosophers) to turn again to the poets -- in this moment, Geoffrey Hill and George Oppen. What he finds in them is "response and reach" (304) -- to "the broken promise of history" (303) first of all, a response and reach in which testimonial verges on the prophetic (304). Baker claims no crystal ball and mounts no soapbox. But one sees where he is headed when he speaks of Oppens' "search for a substantial language" that will "permit us to build a habitable human world … within the open and the dark of the unknown" (311).

I will rashly venture beyond Baker's tactful ending to remark the large number of recent philosophers and cultural and literary theorists -- one could name Slavoj Žižek, Alain Badiou, Gianni Vattimo, Giorgio Agamben, Antonio Negri and Michael Hardt, Julia Kristeva, René Girard, and Lyotard and Derrida as well -- who, though secularists and atheists, have drawn boldly and fruitfully on Christian (and occasionally Jewish) ideas. Perhaps it is time for Christian thinkers to follow their lead and reassert the legitimate authority of their own tradition. Baker might or might not agree with this claim, but his richly erudite, lucidly intelligent, and beautifully written book is indispensable for anyone who wants to understand and reflect on the trajectory of modern culture.