The Factive Turn in Epistemology

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Veli Mitova (ed.), The Factive Turn in Epistemology, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 247pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107175655.

Reviewed by Daniel Whiting, University of Southampton


In 2008, Wayne Riggs suggested that epistemology had taken a value turn.[1] A decade later, Veli Mitova suggests that it has now taken a factive turn. This excellent collection of consistently high quality essays is intended to showcase this recent development. Some contributors seem to be leading the curve, others appear more interested to find out where it leads, others purport to call us back. All have interesting, worthwhile, and novel things to say on one or more of the many issues that arise along the way. The volume as a whole is important reading for anyone with serious interests in epistemology and also, since the issues often intersect with broader concerns, ethics and philosophy of mind.

But what does the advertised factive turn amount to? Knowledge is factive, in the sense that, if a person knows that p, it follows that p. Insofar as knowledge is a central focus of epistemology (by definition no less!) one might be surprised by the suggestion that a concern with factivity is a recent development in the field. I will consider in more detail what it is to take the factive turn below. For now, consider Mitova's opening remark: "When you believe something for a good reason, your belief is in a position to enjoy all the cardinal epistemic blessings", such as being justified, rational, or knowledge (1). According to proponents of the factive turn, the notion of a good reason for believing is, like knowledge, factive. If that p is a good reason for a person to believe a proposition, it follows that p. This is very much a first pass. Again, I will come back to this in due course.

One of the nice features of the volume -- which might reflect its origins in a conference in Vienna in 2015 -- is the unusual degree of interaction among its essays. There are many overlapping themes. Assumptions that one contributor makes another scrutinises. Moreover, and this is evidence of a conscientious editor, readers are not always left to notice these connections for themselves -- there is plenty of cross-referencing between chapters. Given the interconnections, there are no doubt several ways in which Mitova might have organised the volume. But she has chosen to divide the contents into two parts in a way that is, I think, helpful and illuminating. The essays in the first part explore the so-called factive turn "from a purely epistemological angle" (4); that is to say, they focus on the significance of the turn for familiar or traditional debates in epistemology concerning evidence, justification, closure, scepticism, and the like. The essays in the second part consider how the factive turn in epistemology might relate to developments in ethics broadly construed. I will give a brief overview of the chapters in each part in turn.

Duncan Pritchard kicks off Part I by exploring how one might offer a response to the sceptic which combines epistemological disjunctivism -- according to which "one can have perceptual knowledge that p in virtue of seeing that p, where seeing that p is factive, and where it is reflectively accessible to one that one sees that p" (15) -- with a Wittgenstein-inspired hinge epistemology -- according to which the denials of sceptical hypotheses are not possible objects of rational belief (hence, knowledge) but arational commitments that provide the background relative to which beliefs are rational.

Next, Ram Neta makes a subtle intervention in the debate over what constitutes a person's evidence. With Timothy Williamson and against Alvin Goldman,[2] Neta argues that evidence consists of truths, hence, that it is factive. With Goldman and against Williamson, Neta argues that evidence need not be knowledge; it need only be non-inferentially justified. The upshot is that a person's evidence consists of truths that are non-inferentially justified for her.

Patrick Rysiew also develops a factive conception of evidence but of a rather different sort. According to Rysiew, evidence is what makes a proposition "evident" or "manifestly true" (50). So, the evidential relation, as one might put it, is factive. But, Rysiew insists, it does not follow that evidence itself consists of facts or truths, or even truth-apt propositions. Rysiew is an ontological pluralist about what might do the job of evidence.

In his wide-ranging contribution, Jonathan Jenkins Ichikawa argues that, if reasons for believing are facts, externalism about rationality does not follow, where externalism is the view that whether a belief is rational does not supervene upon a person's internal or non-factive mental states. As Ichikawa puts it, "Maybe the kind of changes in reasons that the external can make aren't the kinds of thing that could be or make for changes in rational belief" (69).

Giada Fratantonio and Aidan McGlynn start in a similar way by pointing out that the thesis that evidence is factive is neither sufficient nor necessary for externalism about evidence, a view analogous to externalism about rationality. I return to this point below. Their main aim is to defend against objections raised by Nico Silins,[3] a view they call Entailing Evidence Externalism, according to which subjects in non-sceptical scenarios can have evidence which entails facts about the environment unavailable to their deceived counterparts.

In the closing contribution to Part I, Mikkel Gerken argues that careful reflection on the fine details of various cases of deception challenges the "view according to which epistemic reasons, epistemic warrant, epistemic rationality, or epistemic norms are factive" (102). However, he also argues that denying that the items on the above list are factive does not commit one to denying externalism about such things. A recurring theme in Gerken's chapter is how issues in philosophy of mind -- specifically, concerning externalism about the individuation of mental states -- bear on issues in epistemology.

Turning now to Part II, issues in philosophy of mind also loom large in Williamson's chapter. He suggests that one might understand knowledge as good cognitive functioning and, by contrast, (mere) belief as a cognitive malfunction. By analogy, he suggests that one might understand action as good practical functioning and, by contrast, (mere) intention as a practical malfunction. In closing, he relates this briefly to the topic of epistemic norms. According to Williamson, one might understand (factive) norms such as 'Believe only what you know' or 'Act only on what you know' as standards of proper functioning.

Next Clayton Littlejohn defends two views. First, a belief is justified just in case "it violates no epistemic norms". Second, some epistemic norms have "objective application conditions" or "conditions that don't supervene upon our non-factive mental states" (142). It follows that whether a belief is justified depends on such objective (factive) conditions. This dense but rewarding paper is brimming with arguments. A recurring point is that, since there are objective practical norms, there are objective epistemic norms; otherwise, justified beliefs could not justify actions.

Epistemological issues are very much in the background in Maria Alvarez's contribution. Alvarez defends the view that reasons for action are facts. She considers -- and rejects -- an opposing view according to which, while the reasons there are for a person to act must be facts, the reasons a person has for acting need not be. Alvarez stresses that her "conclusions apply to all 'reasons for'", including reasons for believing (162).

Jonathan Drake defends the opposing position. He argues, first, that motivating reasons, or the reasons for which a person acts, need not be facts. It follows, he suggests, that normative reasons for acting need not be facts. On grounds of uniformity, he concludes that normative reasons for believing need not be facts.

In his contribution, Daniel Fogal also discusses motivating reasons. Again, the focus is on a person's reasons for acting though, again, the points that emerge apply generally. He considers the debate as to whether motivating reasons are facts, propositions, objects, or mental states. Fogal observes that in ordinary discourse all might be cited as a person's reason for acting. There are simply different but complementary ways of providing a distinctive sort of explanation of a person's actions, and which is appropriate depends on the explanatory needs and communicative context. Whatever we cite as a motivating reason serves as a "representative" of or pointer toward the whole body of facts that "does the real explanatory work" (197).

In the final chapter, John Turri presents experimental evidence that the ordinary concepts of justification and evidence are "truth-sensitive", that "in the manifest image" how justified a person is in believing a proposition, or how good her evidence is for that proposition, depends in part on its truth (221). Why, then, do philosophers assume that these concepts are truth-insensitive? One diagnosis Turri presents, among others, is that they confuse justification with blamelessness.

As this cursory overview shows, the various contributions provide interesting counterpoints or complements to one another. It is fair to say, I think, that a concern with epistemological matters does not figure prominently in a number of the essays in Part II, but alongside the other essays their relevance is clear enough.

I will now return to the question of what the factive turn really amounts to. Mitova initially introduces the turn in relation to the following question, "What kind of ontological beast . . . is a good reason for belief?" (1) This suggests two things. First, the "factivist" -- to use Gerken's happy phrase (117) -- has a view about epistemic reasons. Second, and more specifically, they have a view about the ontology of such reasons. Are they facts, states (of mind), (mental) events, propositions, or something else? A factivist, as the name suggests, maintains that they are facts.

However, it is not clear that the dispute between factivists and their opponents -- at least as represented in the pages of this volume -- is concerned in whole or in part with reasons for belief. To give one example, Neta does not mention reasons in his contribution but only evidence. Of course, it is common to suggest that evidence just is a reason for belief, but this is a substantive assumption, one which some contributors reject or at least keep at arm's length. Rysiew, for example, explicitly states that he will not use 'reason' interchangeably with 'evidence' (52n4). To give another example, Williamson speaks only of norms for belief, not reasons. One might think that where there are norms there are reasons. But that is far from obvious when the norms in question are, as Williamson suggests, functional. (There are reasons for a heart to pump blood, for example.) Before introducing the above question, Mitova suggests that the issue in relation to which one might take the factive turn concerns "what sort of things confer . . . epistemic statuses" such as being rational, justified, or warranted (1). Reasons, evidence, and conformity to norms, one might think, are among the things that confer such statuses. But some contributors -- for example, Turri -- focus on the statuses themselves -- for example, being justified -- and not just on whatever it is that confers them.

So, it is not clear that the participants in the factive turn -- again, as represented here -- are exclusively or even primarily concerned with epistemic reasons. Nor do they share in their ontological commitments, contrary to the earlier proposal. It seems that one can be a factivist while denying that reasons -- or whatever confer the relevant epistemic statuses -- are facts. Indeed, Mitova herself suggests that some factivists hold that reasons for believing are or include "veridical perceptual experiences" (2). Experiences, I take it, are mental states (or, perhaps, mental events or processes). In some remarks, Pritchard seems to hold this view. He says, for example, that what grounds perceptual knowledge is "seeing that p" (15). Moreover, as noted above, Rysiew defends a factive conception of evidence but is a pluralist about the ontology of evidence.

It is also doubtful that simply to claim that reasons are facts is enough to qualify as a factivist. As Giada Fratantonio and Aidan McGlynn point out, one might hold that reasons for beliefs are facts but only facts about "how things seem to one" (84) or, more generally, about one's mental life. I doubt that Mitova thinks of the factive turn as a turn toward views such as this, that is, as a turn toward the inner, as one might put it. Perhaps, instead, what makes one a factivist is that one thinks that reasons for believing are (typically or paradigmatically) facts about the (non-mental) world. But in other remarks Pritchard suggests that what provides support for one's (knowledgeable) belief is the reflectively accessible fact "that one sees that p" (15). This, I take it, is a fact about the mind, albeit a fact which entails a fact about the world.

This might suggest that what makes one a factivist is that one thinks that reasons for belief, or whatever else confers statuses such as being justified, or, for that matter, the statuses themselves, entail facts about the world, at least when those beliefs concern extra-mental reality. However, this characterisation does not really distinguish factivist views from more traditional externalist views, according to which a belief is justified, for example, only if certain environmental conditions obtain. Presumably, the rise of externalism in epistemology was a development predating the factive turn.

In his contribution, Gerken makes some remarks which might help us to distinguish factivist views from more familiar versions of externalism. According to the traditional externalist, Gerken notes, whether a belief enjoys a status such as justification depends on "the types of patterns of relations that normally hold between the agent and the environment" (118), for example, whether forming a belief of that sort in the relevant way is truth-conducive in normal environments. In contrast, Gerken suggests, factivists "focus on the token occurrences" (118). That is, they hold that whether a belief is justified, say, depends on whether it is in fact true.

I think that Gerken here understands factivists as holding that only true beliefs are justified. While some of those this volume represents -- most notably, Littlejohn and Williamson -- endorse this, it is not a commitment of participants in the factive turn in general. One might think with Neta that evidence consists of facts, for example, while allowing that such evidence can justify false beliefs. Moreover, both Littlejohn and Williamson claim that a belief is justified (or proper) only if it is knowledge. It is open to them to allow that whether a belief is knowledge, hence, justified or proper, depends in turn on the types of patterns Gerken mentions. (I am not here criticising Gerken. In the remarks above, he is not trying to provide an informative characterisation of the factive turn.)

In view of the above, I am suspicious of the suggestion that there really is a unified or distinctive movement or development in recent epistemology that deserves to be called a 'factive turn', or, at least, I do not feel that the volume affords a clear idea of what that turn amounts to. However, I do not think that this issue of presentation need diminish the significance of this collection. Again, the various contributions are all worthwhile additions to the literature. And, although they are not unified in advancing or opposing a particular approach or position, there remain, as I stressed at the start, interesting and illuminating connections among them. Even when the authors do not explicitly refer to one another, the overall impression is that of a genuine conversation on issues of real importance for epistemology and related fields, indeed, of an unusually productive conversation by prevailing philosophical standards.

[1] W. Riggs, "The Value Turn in Epistemology", in New Waves in Epistemology, ed. V. Hendricks and D. Pritchard (Palgrave, 2008).

[2] See T. Williamson, Knowledge and its Limits (Oxford University Press, 2000) and A. Goldman, "Williamson on knowledge and Evidence", in Williamson on Knowledge, ed. P. Greenough and D. Pritchard (Oxford University Press, 2009).

[3] N. Silins, "Deception and Evidence", Philosophical Perspectives (2005), 109: 375-404.