The Facts in Logical Space: A Tractarian Ontology

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Jason Turner, The Facts in Logical Space: A Tractarian Ontology, Oxford University Press, 2016, 362pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682812.

Reviewed by Paul Hovda, Reed College


Facts are somehow prior to objects (and properties and relations). This idea, call it factalism, is one of the many intriguing but underdeveloped ideas in Wittgenstein's Tractatus. Jason Turner's book is a careful, detailed, and extensive development of this idea.

Turner's factalism is much more developed than Wittgenstein's, but is it any more appealing? Remarkably, Turner himself does not accept any version of factalism, as he confesses in his brief Conclusion. He reminds us that "there is more of interest than just the truth," (p. 332) and suggests that the project was worthwhile for a number of reasons, including that we learn something deep about the "nature of ontological structure" from the proposed reduction of objects (and relations) to facts and their "geometric" structure that is the core of the book. Eventually, I will outline some reasons why I am unsure about these "deep and far-reaching insights into the nature of ontology" (p. 333).

But this is an excellent piece of analytic metaphysics: the care, precision, detail, and breadth of Turner's presentation constitute a model for how to develop a metaphysical idea. Anyone intrigued by the basic factalist idea will learn an immense amount about it from this book, and would be unwise to attempt to develop or evaluate it without thinking through the body of related issues that Turner insightfully explores.

I will give an overview of the book, a more detailed discussion of the central ideas of the first three chapters, and a brief critical evaluation. There is much more in the book that merits consideration than can be addressed here; after the overview, I focus on just one central line of development.

The first chapter motivates and sketches Turner's distinctive form of factalism, which holds that the world ultimately or fundamentally consists only of facts, facts with no internal structure, but which bear some fundamental, external, quasi-geometric relations to one another. A few applications are sketched; most importantly, the potential for a satisfying combinatorial account of modality. Since the world certainly appears to include objects that are not facts, one of the central projects is to explain how this appearance arises out of the fundamental reality.

At the core of Turner's approach are the metaphysical thesis that the appearance of objects (and relations) arises out of the quasi-geometric features of the facts (thus the title of the book), and a formal (mathematical) theorem that Turner develops and proves over the course of the second and third chapters. The formal and informal materials are developed together, but never confused. While the fine details of the proofs are placed in separate sections, a great deal of the content of Chapters 2 through 4 is formal, filled with technical definitions, axioms, lemmas, and the like.

Turner discusses many choice points throughout the book, offering considerations for and against different approaches, and sometimes, but not always, picking a favorite.

Chapter 2 develops Turner's quasi-geometrical formal theory of facts. There are two primitive relations, in a setting of first-order logic augmented with plural quantification. Facts are like points in a space. Some facts are "connected" with others in various manners. Maximal collections of facts that are "connected" in one or another of these manners form something like sub-spaces of the total space, including "hypersurfaces" and "quality spaces." These sub-spaces will end up corresponding to objects and relations (respectively) in the realm of appearances that gets generated from the realm of facts.

Chapter 3 develops the main formal theorem, which is that there is an exact correspondence between, on the one hand, systems that realize the quasi-geometrical axioms for the facts, and, on the other hand, systems that have the structure of a set of objects combined with a set of relations on those objects. This theorem is the mathematical model for the metaphysical claim that the quasi-geometric structure of the facts in logical space naturally gives rise to the appearance of a field of objects with relations on them. Closely related informal and formal issues are discussed along the way.

Chapter 4 develops several candidate combinatorial accounts of modality. Classic and novel objections to such accounts are dutifully considered, and Turner makes a number of interesting moves in response to some of them. (It would be possible to extract from this chapter a short but helpful paper on modality that would not depend on many of the details of the factalism of the previous chapters, but, as it is, the discussion is mostly intertwined with the development of quasi-geometric factalism.) Some combinatorial theories entertained are eliminative, while others make use of primitive modality (or quasi-modal notions like a metaphysical analogue of entailment) for a restricted sphere (explaining other modal propositions in terms of the restricted sphere). There is a discussion of the Barcan formula and the usual issues connected with it.

Chapter 5 deals with the project of giving (or showing how in principle there could be) a satisfying enough (not too "hand wavy") explanation of how there could be determinate connections between words of an actual language (that appears to speak of objects and relations) and pieces of the factalist's fundamental reality (hypersurfaces, quality spaces, etc.).

The final chapter covers a few "Alternatives and applications" of the preceding material. An especially striking discussion concerns "Ontological Nihilism," which holds that there is nothing whatsoever. Here we see perhaps the most radical, and perhaps the most pure, version of factalism: while the main flavors of factalism say, using a first-order quantifier, that there are lots of facts (and there are no tables and chairs, at least not fundamentally speaking), the Nihilist does not. What would the Nihilist say, if she could speak to us at all? Roughly, she would use bits of language that are somehow of the category "sentence," but which have no internal semantically significant structure, as well as bits of language built up from these, using things of the category "sentential operator."

The content, motivation, and intellectual style of Turner's development of factalism can be seen in its contrast with factalist positions Turner rejects, like flat-footed factalism, or FFF for short, and another we will meet in a moment.

First, a little set-up and terminology. Turner uses "fact" to mean something like "possible fact" -- a given "fact" might be true or false. Facts form the base for reducing apparent objects and properties. (Later, Turner explains how the reduction base might be modified to include only true facts, so that the main development is compatible with the idea that only true facts exist at all.)

Now, what are the appearances that are to be reduced? Objects and relations, and, of central importance, atomic propositions: for each n-adic relation (including the 1-adic relations that are the monadic properties) and each sequence of n objects, there is exactly one proposition that consists of that relation, predicated of those objects in that order. These are the atomic propositions. We imagine also that there are logically complex propositions.

Flat-footed factalism (FFF) illustrates a too-crude attempt to reduce these appearances to facts. Its story is just that there is a one-to-one correspondence between facts and all the propositions.

Propositions have internal structure: the atomic proposition that Socrates is sitting is in some way made out of Socrates and the property of sitting, for example. With FFF, the facts have no corresponding structure. All we can say is that there is one and only one fact f that corresponds to the proposition that Socrates is sitting, one and only one fact g that corresponds to the proposition that someone is sitting. It is not part of our ideology that g arises from f by abstracting out Socrates from f, or any such operation.

Now, Turner endorses this objection to FFF: it offers no explanation of inferential relations between appearances. Though there is an obvious asymmetric inferential relation between the proposition "Someone is sitting" and the proposition "Socrates is sitting," FFF, by denying internal structure to the facts, offers nothing in its picture of fundamental reality that accounts for the asymmetry. The advocate of FFF could introduce a further metaphysical postulate, e.g., a primitive necessitation relation that relates f to g but not vice-versa, but this would severely compromise her ability to give a combinatorial account of modality, and would ruin the desert landscape, so to speak.

Turner next considers shrinking the class of ultimate facts to create space for a different explanation of the inferential asymmetry above. Basically, we adopt an "atomism" that says that each fact corresponds to an atomic proposition and no fact corresponds (directly) to a logically complex proposition. Then, following Wittgenstein, the factalist can regard the logically complex propositions as inheriting their truth-values by way of truth-functions, in a rule-governed way, corresponding to the Wittgensteinian truth-tables and reduction of quantifiers to truth-functions.

Thus we consider a factalism that posits a class of completely unstructured facts that primitively give rise, in a one-to-one manner, to precisely the propositions that we regard as atomic. These in turn give rise, by a different mechanism, to logically complex propositions, and also to the apparent objects and relations that they appear to be constituted out of.

Turner does not name this form of factalism. Let us call it AFFF, atomic flat-footed factalism. Turner objects to AFFF in section 1.6 with "The problem of the patterns", which runs basically as follows: unless the factalist can say something about the features of the postulated unstructured facts that explain how they give rise to apparently structured atomic propositions, AFFF won't include enough detail to be plausible. It would be saying: "there is something, I know not what, about these facts, that somehow yields an apparent world of objects and relations, but all I know definitely is that there is one fact per atomic proposition."

The foregoing provides a sketch of how Turner motivates his distinctive reductive proposal, which may be understood as supplementing AFFF with the thesis that the fundamental facts have external structure: there are certain quasi-geometric relations among the facts, which are structurally suited to give rise to the appearance not just of some propositions, but precisely of a system or field of propositions that appear to have the internal structure we would see if they were systematically constituted out of relations predicated of objects. (Systematically: given that there is a proposition that Socrates is sitting, and a proposition that Plato is standing, then for sure there also exists a proposition that Socrates is standing, etc.)

This is the motivation for the formal development (definitions and proofs and such) that occupies much of Chapters 2 and 3: Turner carefully shows that if the quasi-geometric structure of the facts obeys certain axioms, then it is formally guaranteed that they will be suited to give rise to an apparent systematic field of atomic propositions. At the heart of the technical development is a kind of isomorphism theorem: anything that obeys those axioms is isomorphic to what you would get if you formed a class of atomic propositions out of some objects and relations.

We will now go into some detail to approximate the content of the theorem. Define a formal representation of what it would be for some things to be structurally like a class of objects and n-adic relations: e.g., as a function A whose domain is the set of natural numbers and where A(0) is to be thought of as the objects, and A(n) for n > 0 is to be thought of as the set of n-ary relations. Following Turner, call such a collection a "frame." Next, model the set of atomic propositions that can be formed from these objects and relations, as the set of "appropriate" sequences, where a sequence is appropriate if its first entry is an n-adic relation, and it contains exactly n more entries, each of which is an object. Call the induced set of sequences the "field" for the frame.

Now define, for any field generated by any frame, the following two relations on the members of the field. Let S be the relation that holds among two field members when they share at least one object as an entry. Let B(w,x,y,z) be the 4-adic relation on field members that holds exactly when both (1) w, x, y, and z share the same relational entry (the first entry), and (2) w and x differ in at most one spot in their object entries, at the nth entry say, and y and z differ in at most one spot, the same one, the nth entry. Thus the B relation does hold of a four-tuple that looks like (R(a,b,c), R(e,b,c), R(d,b,c), R(b,b,c)) but does not hold of (R(a,b,c), R(e,b,c), R(a,b,c), R(a,c,c)) (assuming that objects a through e are all distinct). The field together with these two relations on it may be called, following Turner, the "canonical geometry" for the frame that generated it. (Below, I will speak of "the S, B language;" take this as a language interpreting two relation symbols as referring to the S and B relations on fields generated from frames.)

Turner provides a set of axioms in a language with symbols for just two non-logical relations: a binary relation symbol that looks like a squiggly equal sign, and a 4-adic relation symbol that looks like a bowtie. He proves that for any field generated from any frame, if we interpret the squiggle with the S relation on that field, and interpret the bowtie with the B relation, then all of the axioms are satisfied. More remarkably, he proves that any collection of things (with two relations) that satisfy the axioms is isomorphic to the field of some frame (with its induced S and B relations). (The proof, as presented in section 3.6.1, is slightly marred by the central use of a notion of "pairing" that is not nearly as explicitly defined as most of the technical notions in the book, but I have no reason to think that it is not essentially correct.)

Thus the axioms capture the common structure of the canonical geometries (the S and B relations on fields), and this is the formal undergirding of the metaphysical claim that the quasi-geometric structure of the facts explains their giving rise to an apparent class of atomic propositions systematically generated from objects and relations. The factalist uses squiggle and bowtie to state her distinctive theory about fundamental reality, asserting the axioms.

There are many non-equivalent ways to capture some structural features common to all fields and sufficient to yield an isomorphism theorem of this general sort, which raises the question which is the right or best way.

One variant, discussed by Turner in section 2.5.2, flows from the following issue. The two propositions R(a,b) and R(b,a) are "qualitatively indistinguishable" in the S, B language: they satisfy the same open formulas of that language. This language, augmented with a truth predicate, cannot distinguish two apparently distinct worlds that differ over which one of "F(a) and R(a,b)" and "F(a) and R(b,a)" is true (and differ in no other relevant ways). One response to this phenomenon is to augment the fundamental ideology so as to register a fundamental qualitative difference between the worlds. Turner shows one way to do this, with his "glow" predicate, whose effect is roughly to make the order of the arguments in n-adic relational predications a formal feature that ends up being included as part of the central isomorphism theorem.

As Turner notes, a very different response a factalist might have is to argue that any difference not capturable by the parallel to the S, B language is not a genuine difference, and thus that the two apparently distinct worlds are in fact the same. She might attribute the seeming difference to a mere convention regarding the "orientation" of our binary predicate for the R relation.

"Glow" adds structure to Turner's axioms, providing more "morph" for an isomorphism theorem, but one might want less than what Turner's approach builds in. Here is one motivation for an approach that is different from any that Turner explicitly considers.

Perhaps some binary relations R are "deeply symmetric:" for distinct a, b, there is only one (possible) fact that corresponds to the two orderings of a and b when we predicate R of a and b. For such an R, if R(a,b) and R(b,a) are distinct appearances, we thus do not want to fix on the B relation among the appearances when picking out the formal features of them that we capture in our central isomorphism theorem, and we do not then want a one-one, onto mapping between the facts and the appearances. If, instead, we regard R(a,b) and R(b,a) as the same appearance (atomic proposition), then we must re-define the notion of field, our formal model of the system of atomic appearances, so that there is only one thing where we would have had two. But we wouldn't want to randomly choose one of the sequences (R,a,b) and (R,b,a) and include it and not the other, and then use the B relation on the result, for the B relation will then pick up on an unjustifiable pattern of coordination and lack thereof among our choices for various pairs of objects. (The situation is even worse if we include "glow.") It is natural to use the sequence (R, {a, b}) to model the single symmetric relational proposition. But the B relation is not defined for such sequences, and there is no obvious way to extend its definition for them.

An alternative framework can yield an isomorphism similar to Turner's, but with the desired flexibility regarding relations. The basic idea is to start with two primitive plural predicates H and Q, corresponding to Turner's notion of "hypersurface" and "quality space." Here is the barest sketch of how to proceed: for fields as defined above, and for each object x in the frame that generated it, its hypersurface h is the set of propositions (sequences) in which x appears at least once as an entry. Let H be the set of hypersurfaces. And for each relation, its quality space is the set of propositions in which it appears; let Q be the set of quality spaces. Now there are distinctive truths about the H's and the Q's that hold in every field: e. g., Q partitions the propositions. We may axiomatize these distinctive truths in a manner similar to the way Turner axiomatizes the truths that hold for the S and B relations on the fields. But the notions of H and Q extend much more easily than S and B to a framework for modelling the deeply symmetric relations just discussed.[1] (The resulting framework might be alleged to attribute too little structure to the facts, however; unfortunately, there is no room for further discussion here.)

I turn now to an assessment of Turner's project. Recall that Turner objected to AFFF (the atomic variant of the flat-footed factalist) that it ought to say more than simply that there is something, we know not what, about the facts, that makes them give rise to the systematic appearances. Turner's factalist seems to say more: there are these relations, called squiggle and bowtie, on the facts, and they satisfy these axioms, which turns out to guarantee that they are isomorphic to a systematic field of atomic propositions.

There is a fairly obvious line of objection that starts roughly like this: we do not know what squiggle and bowtie mean. (The main development treats the two relation symbols as primitive ideology; a variant factalist could formulate an official theory by "quantifying out:" there exist relations, call them squiggle and bowtie, such that . . . )

We might imagine asking Turner's factalist: why do the facts give rise to appearances that have the formal structure of a field of atomic propositions? Answer: Because the facts themselves have the formal structure of such a field, which happens to be expressible by the following axioms . . .

Putting the answer this way suggests that Turner's factalist has not done significantly better than AFFF, replacing "something, we know not what," with "some structure, we know not what." How deeply this line of objection cuts is not obvious. For one thing, the factalist can stress that the S and B relations clearly flow from internal structure, while squiggle and bowtie can be maintained to be external. But we can pursue the dialectic no further here.

Recall that Turner ultimately suggests that even if the book does not persuade us to become factalists, we still learn something from the isomorphism that the factalist draws our attention to, in the way that we learn something about the numbers from a proposed reduction of arithmetic to set theory: "Whether the numbers are sets or not, we learn something deep about the structure of mathematics when we see how the reductions are supposed to go" (p. 332).

There are two concerns I will sketch for Turner's project at this global level. The first is that the S and B relations on the propositions are not obviously as fundamental to (our thought about) the interconnections among objects, properties, and propositions as are the relations of successor, less-than, sum, and product to (our thought about) the interconnections among numbers. When one sees exactly what the isomorphism theorem is saying, it is not clear whether the "quasi-geometric" S, B structure and its relation to the "hypersurfaces" and "quality spaces" is central or peripheral. (This issue is subtle and deserves elaboration.)

A rather different concern is that the S, B structure may not be the right one to fix on, since, as illustrated by the example above of deeply symmetric relations, we may not find it metaphysically plausible that that structure is the one that is immediately inherited from the fundamental structure of the facts. That is: the proposed reduction might basically be incorrect.

Thus, there is (unsurprisingly -- philosophy is hard!) room for doubt about whether the main strand of the book yields "deep and far-reaching" insights into ontology (or our ways of thinking). But even if the deep insights aren't yet established, Turner's work addresses, from a novel perspective, questions the definitive answers to which might well yield deep insight, and it provides a vivid sense of answers these questions plausibly might have.


For helpful comments on earlier drafts of this review, thanks to Jason Turner and also to the participants in a Reed College Philosophy lunch colloquium, especially Troy Cross.

[1] Central axioms to "control" classical (not deeply symmetric) n-adic relations would include the following (sketched here set-theoretically; officially, we would use primitive plural predicates for Q and H). If there are no n+1 distinct H's that have a non-empty joint intersection with a given Q (call it Y), but there are n distinct H's that do, then Y should behave as an n-ary relation should: for each i <= n, for any i distinct H's, there should be exactly s(i,n) things each of which is in all of those H's and in no other H's, and also in Y; where s(i,n) is the number of distinct sequences of length n that can be formed by drawing entries from a fixed set s with i members, drawing each member of s at least once. For a Q that corresponds to a deeply symmetric binary relation, we would say (among other things): for any two distinct H's there is exactly one thing in both of them and also in that Q, and in no other H.