The Fall and Hypertime

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Hud Hudson, The Fall and Hypertime, Oxford University Press, 2014, 211pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198712693.

Reviewed by Trent Dougherty, Baylor University


Hud Hudson's book is a brilliant and creative defense of the following proposition.

There is a conflict between a literal reading of the book of Genesis and science only if one assumes that the hypertime hypothesis is false.

The import of Hudson's thesis is that those who allege a conflict between science and a literal reading of Genesis are not basing that claim merely on science but on controversial metaphysics as well. A literal reading of Genesis (hereafter "LRG") is, essentially, one that entails that humans have been extant for no more than 8,000 years and that cosmic evil is a result of some first sin by some first humans (whether two or a somewhat larger community). Hudson considers a number of accommodationist strategies for weakening the doctrine of the Fall (and the associated doctrines of Original Sin and Original Guilt) and finally settles on a version prominently advocated by van Inwagen (as true for all we know).

To understand the hypertime hypothesis (hereafter "HH"), begin with the "growing block" theory of time, one of the standard set of options. According to this theory, the past is real and "still exists" as a "block" as spacetime and the future is "open," i.e. the future does not exist. The block grows as the quantity of either space or time increases. Hudson notes that there is nothing more intrinsically mysterious about the block losing parts than its gaining parts. He then points out that it is also not more intrinsically mysterious that a "morphing block" shrink or grow not just in units of hyperplanes ("slices" of the block) but also in sub-regions of hyperplanes. As a result, there are no in principle limits to the ways in which a block can morph, to the "shape" it can take. Furthermore, there is no good reason why the hyperplanes (or sub-regions thereof) might not be "reshuffled" in a different order.

Because the universe is here modeled as a spacetime block, the temporal dimension only measures changes within the block. Hypertime measures, as we may think of it, changes to the block (though technically blocks at different hypertimes are numerically distinct,and there remains a question concerning the status of various essentialisms about blocks with respect to their parts). That means that at any given moment on the hypertimeline, there can be a complete spacetime block, a complete physical universe distinct from blocks at different hypertimes. Given infinite hypertime, this generates a plurality of worlds not unlike that of David Lewis. Hudson applies the possibility of this plurality in three ways: to an understanding of omnipresence (which I will not discuss), to (three versions of) the problem of evil (one of which I'll discuss below), and in defense of his main thesis. The way HH helps with an understanding of omniscience and the problem of evil gives it credit and motivates it as a viable option so that its application to the main thesis is not ad hoc (though it's being ad hoc would not prevent its success for its purpose). I will describe the application to the problem of evil, offer a criticism, then describe its application to the main thesis.

If there is a plenitude of spatiotemporally discrete universes, then it is difficult to infer from any empirical observation that the actual world is not the best possible world. It is important to remember that on the hypertime hypothesis the spacetime blocks at different hypermoments are only one portion of total reality. Our observable universe is a drop in the bucket. So an argument from evil against the existence of God from ours not being the best possible world would have to argue that the observable universe could not even be a part of the best possible world. That is not clearly an easy argument to make.

This move takes the form of what is traditionally called a "defense" rather than a "theodicy" (though this distinction is of little value to probabilists). The schema of a defense of theism against an argument from evil goes essentially like this. Let X be the proposition at play in the particular problem of evil, whether the existence of gratuitous evil, or that this is not the best of all possible worlds, or that some particular act is intrinsically impermissible to allow, or any proposition incompatible with the existence of God (note that the so-called "evidential" problem of evil is still an incompatibility argument, it's just one for which the empirical hypothesis requires serious evidence). Let Y be some relevant consequence of X.

X only if Y. But we don't know whether Y, so we don't know whether X.

The relevant instance here is this (mutatis mutandis).

We know this is not the best of all possible worlds only if we know HH is false. But we don't know that HH is false, so we don't know this is not the best possible world.

My criticism of this move is that the (epistemic) possibility premise is in considerable doubt. HH is a theory in abstract metaphysics, one competitor among several. Some might be forgiven for claiming that this alone is a sufficient basis to know that it is false. And even if the verdict is not that grim, it certainly seems permissible to assume that it is false, even if it is defensible. In fact, though, even the optimistic verdict that we don't know HH to be false doesn't really help alleviate the problem of evil that much since  those who reasonably believe some state of affairs obtains that is incompatible with God's existence can, ceteris paribus, reasonably believe theism is false. Still, there may be an argument in the offing that one could reasonably believe HH if it were given some more argument. Then it could play a significant role. Hudson leaves many hints at ways one could explore to further warrant HH. This is but one respect in which HH describes a research project for further investigation.

Having made an argument for the utility of HH for religion in the penultimate chapter, Hudson makes his application of HH to his main thesis in the final chapter. The following is a sketch of its outlines. Imagine a universe -- conceived as a spacetime block -- in which obtain all the truthmakers for a literal reading of Genesis. That is, a literal reading of Genesis describes exactly and literally what happens in this universe (spacetime block) up to the point of the Fall (perhaps including the banishing from the Garden). The hyperplane of that threespace that makes up the "leading edge" contains Adam and Eve passing through the threshold of the Garden. If HH is true, then God can take that hyperplane and place it at the leading edge of a spacetime block at a different hypertime which has been developing for billions of years exactly as our best science describes. Assuming the personal identity of Adam and Eve carries over from the "transplant" (a thesis that is not much defended but to which there is no obvious obstacle), then so long as Adam and Eve are situated at the right spot in hominid evolution, we can all be descended from them (or a small group, on a variant), they evolved from more primitive pre-human creatures (this fact is made true by the new spacetime block in which they are situated), and yet their full transhypertemporal biography can be accurately described by a literal reading of the book of Genesis.

Some might think of this as ad hoc, but that doesn't stop it from establishing Hudson's thesis. Furthermore, it would not be at all odd if the Bible took the perspective of hypertime, which would be, after all, God's perspective. Additionally, given a plurality of worlds, which HH secures, it would not be at all odd if the primordial "Garden" were in fact a separate spacetime block, and their ejection from that "Garden" involved transplantation in another hypertemporally adjacent spacetime.

This account meets the description of a traditional theistic defense story: it is a consistent story that contains both the truth of a literal reading of Genesis and the truth of our currently best science. In so telling such a story, Hudson has achieved his primary goal, which is to establish that if there is a conflict between current science and a literal reading of Genesis, it is only on the condition of the assumption of a theory of the metaphysics of time that can be disputed and for which there is a clear and theistically attractive alternative (another research project Hudson leaves the reader is to flesh out is the way in which HH has all the explanatory power of Lewis's plurality of worlds but with some advantages). And while I have suggested one plausible line according to which one could doubt HH and its effectiveness (without further independent support) in addressing the problem of evil, this is a long way from there being an argument that HH is false. And one would think that those making the claim of conflict with the vim and vigor that usually accompany such claims would need to give an argument for this (dispensable) assumption.

The reader of Hudson's book will be richly rewarded with penetrating and creative discussion of theology, epistemology, metaphysics, and philosophy of religion applied to one of the major disputes of our day regarding the rational status of religious beliefs.