The Fall of Language: Benjamin and Wittgenstein on Meaning

Placeholder book cover

Alexander Stern, The Fall of Language: Benjamin and Wittgenstein on Meaning, Harvard University Press, 2019, 386pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674980914.

Reviewed by Alison Ross, Monash University


Walter Benjamin's early 1916 essay 'On Language as Such, and on the Language of Man' articulates a theory of language that has a foundational place in his thinking. The essay was not originally intended for publication. It has its origins in a letter to his friend Gershom Scholem, written when Benjamin was 24 and Scholem just 19. Scholem transformed the study of the Kabbalah from a topic of sporadic commentary into a disciplinary field and became the acknowledged preeminent scholar of Jewish mystical traditions. Benjamin's thinking and impact is more difficult to classify. In his book, Alexander Stern treats the essay as the key to Benjamin's entire philosophy, and uses the essay's theses as a point of connection between Benjamin and other thinkers and traditions. Stern sees connections between Benjamin's essay on language and what he refers to as an 'expressivist' and 'aesthetic' tradition of language, whose characteristics, he argues, are also present in the later works of Wittgenstein. The choice of the term 'aesthetic' to describe this tradition reflects Stern's view that Benjamin and Wittgenstein aim to restore a depth of meaning to the world, one that Stern thinks has been lost through modern, i.e., scientific, disenchantment, and which he traces to the exponents of the German philosophical tradition such as Hamann, Herder, Nietzsche, and Fritz Mauthner. The 'aesthetic' view of language in this loose collection of German philosophers provides an important reference for Stern's general thesis. Although Stern thinks Benjamin and the later Wittgenstein share the aesthetic approach to language associated with this tradition, he contrasts the two thinkers on many points, and in such instances his sympathies are consistently with the position on 'aesthetic meaning' he ascribes to Benjamin.

The book is divided into three parts and nine chapters. Part I is devoted to Benjamin's philosophy of language, as outlined in the 1916 essay. Its three chapters treat the metaphysical framework of Benjamin's early theory of language; Benjamin's account of the character of 'actual' human language; and, Stern's analysis of how Benjamin develops his philosophy of language into a 'fully-fledged epistemology' by way of his theory of ideas (92). This third chapter treats the famous 'Epistemo-Critical Foreword' to Benjamin's study on the German Trauerspiel. The first two chapters are focused on the 1916 essay.

In Part II, Stern considers 'The History of Language as Such'. The four chapters here reflect his change in focus from Benjamin to Wittgenstein, primarily by reference to the German expressivist tradition that Stern thinks sheds light on his topic. These chapters cover the content and influence of Hamann's expressivist ideas in Herder and Schlegel; the thesis of the expressivity of art in Herder and Hamann as well as Benjamin's 1919 dissertation The Concept of Criticism in German Romanticism; the conceptual connections between Wittgenstein's philosophy and Fritz Mauthner's 'critique of language'; and the analysis of the later Wittgenstein's work, including the private language argument, in relation to Mauthner's views. Although Wittgenstein's Tractatus refers negatively to Mauthner's critique, Stern argues that Wittgenstein's later work 'exhibits unmistakable evidence of a positive influence from Mauthner, in both general orientation and rhetorical detail' (217).

Part III comprises two chapters comparing Benjamin and Wittgenstein. The first deals primarily with what Stern refers to as the differences between aesthetic (Benjamin) and practical (Wittgenstein) expressivism. On Stern's account both thinkers have a broadly 'aesthetic' conception of language; however, whereas Benjamin understands the foundation of meaning as aesthetic, Wittgenstein conceives of 'meaning as use'. The first position is based in the expressivist view that 'meaning is an ultimate, always pre-existent given' (40), while the second takes the functioning of meaning as primary. The latter position yields a more modest theory of meaning than the former since it is interested in how language engages the practical context of human activity (297). Wittgenstein criticises the ways the designative view of language overlooks 'the origins of designation in particular kinds of language-games' (297). Meaning lies in what language does, and not in some designative connection 'present in the structure or logic of language itself' (297).

The final chapter focuses specifically on the ethical implications of his chosen thinkers' critiques of 'externalized language'. Benjamin and Wittgenstein, Stern writes, 'both demand of us that we not accept the world as it is reflected to us in vacant, enthralling language, but continually strive, in both word and deed, to articulate it anew' (365). The core of Stern's position is that language understood and practiced aesthetically affords an experience of meaning, in the sense that it is engaging, creative and participatory; it thus effects a fundamental renewal of experience. In Benjamin, this stance regarding language is metaphysical and epistemological, whereas for the late Wittgenstein it is pragmatic.

Benjamin and Wittgenstein are not as singular as they prima facie seem but belong to the 'expressivist tradition'. This thesis opens the door to comparative analysis and exegetical attention to their expressivist antecedents. The book is nicely written, but might have covered its territory more concisely. There is a largely self-contained chapter on Hamann that appears to be a detour, perhaps because Stern's thesis of 'influence' as the rationale for its inclusion seems too loose. Despite its length, the book is somewhat selective about the scholarship it consults on the main figures, and occasionally looks past relevant literature and debates that offer alternative frames of reference. The strategy seems intentional. For instance, Stern introduces his discussion of some of the main positions in contemporary Wittgenstein scholarship as if this were a 'digression' (266). There is no attempt to systematically discuss relevant scholarship on Benjamin. In fact, competing interpretations are neither named (in relation to authorship) nor discussed, but evoked in general terms. In reference to Adamic language, Stern writes: 'Benjamin does not imagine this language to even approximate a real, historical original language, despite the manner in which Benjamin's theory is sometimes interpreted' (54). It would have been interesting to know about the source that advances such a position, and the grounds on which it does so; however, no further details are provided.

The overall position on Benjamin's philosophy of language is made to fit in with a schematic position advanced by Charles Taylor. Stern quotes approvingly Taylor's division in philosophy of language between what he classifies as an 'expressivist' tradition (Hamann, Herder, Humboldt) and the 'designative' tradition (Hobbes, Locke, Condillac) (7). This classification becomes a type of explanatory prism through which Benjamin's language essay is refracted. Stern also uses it to place Wittgenstein in a philosophical tradition. G.H. von Wright comments that Wittgenstein's 'later philosophy' appears to be

entirely outside any philosophical tradition and without literary sources of influence. For this very reason it is exceedingly difficult to understand and characterize. The author of the Tractatus learned from Frege and Russell. His problems grew out of theirs. The author of the Philosophical Investigations has no ancestors in philosophy. (cited in Stern, 9)

Stern argues against this position that 'much of what appears utterly original and, possibly, baffling in Wittgenstein's thought . . . finds its roots in the expressivist tradition' (9). Similarly, the expressivist tradition provides Stern a compass to navigate Benjamin's notoriously difficult writing and downplay its singularity. Benjamin's important essays are often characterised in the book as 'opaque' (5, 21), and the expressivist tradition as well as the comparative perspective on Wittgenstein are used to gain a viewpoint on the corpus not otherwise available. However, the omission of relevant Benjamin scholarship from the discussion blinkers Stern's analysis of this challenging writer. Below, I give a short overview of the main issues of interpretation raised in Stern's chapters on Wittgenstein, before examining in more detail the implications of his proposed framework for the analysis of Benjamin's work.

In Stern's treatment of Wittgenstein, the reader gets a clear view of how his 'expressivist' approach relates to some of the major trends of Wittgenstein scholarship. In particular, Stern disputes certain aspects of the so-called 'resolute' account of Wittgenstein. He discusses this account as it is presented in the works of James Conant and Cora Diamond, and in relation to their points of divergence from what is known as the 'standard reading' of Wittgenstein. Against the resolute reading's emphasis on continuity between the earlier and later Wittgenstein, Stern sees a profound shift, which he interprets in relation to Wittgenstein's turn toward 'a German-language cultural and intellectual milieu that took the expressive and aesthetic character of language seriously' (4). Pinpointing this shift is seemingly difficult; it occurred, in Stern's words, 'after -- and perhaps during -- the composition of the Tractatus' (5). In contrast, according to the resolute reading, there is 'a programmatic continuity between the Tractatus and the [Philosophical] Investigations', which consists in correcting the view that philosophy is able to 'provide . . . insight into the structure of language and its relation to the world' (282). In the resolute perspective, the Tractatus does not 'attempt to mark the limit between the sayable and the unsayable', instead it details a theory that 'is simply an example of a kind of theorizing we need to overcome' (282). In Stern's view, in contrast, Wittgenstein's early 'notion [in the Tractatus] that there might be some limit to the sayable is . . . dissolved by the turn toward use in the Investigations' (284). The significance of this interpretative position is that 'it is precisely the expansion of Wittgenstein's understanding of the form and function of language that allows him to give up both the notion of the "sayable" and the notion that there must be a limit to the "sayable"' (284-5). These 'notions' 'plague the Tractatus'; according to Stern, Wittgenstein's expressivism of use resolves them (285). The perspective is key to understanding Wittgenstein's distinction between language showing the '"logical form of reality"', in a way that cannot be said '"by means of language"'. This showing of, rather than saying in, language is interpreted by Stern in relation to the expressivist thesis, which is 'important in the Investigations [and] already present in the Tractatus. Indeed, it is revealed in the end to have been the mode of expression of the Tractatus itself' (288). The shift he outlines, then, might not be a shift at all, but a clarifying perspective that can bring aspects of the earlier work in line with the mature, 'expressivist' assumptions of the later work.

Stern's exegetical work in the early parts of the book often presents the extraordinary complexity of Benjamin's ideas in satisfying detail. The discussion of the concept of extremity in the third chapter is one of these places (111). This concept is developed in the famous 'Epistemo-Critical Foreword' to Benjamin's study of the German Trauerspiel. The study, which had been intended as Benjamin's Habilitation thesis, was withdrawn upon the advice that it would not be accepted.[1] It is telling that the concept of extremity outlined in this Foreword cannot be folded into the thesis of a series of 'influences' purportedly shaping Benjamin's views and incorporating them into a loose German 'intellectual milieu'. In other words, Stern's treatment of the concept is illuminating precisely because it looks at this difficult concept from the perspective of what Benjamin wants from it and does with it.

Less satisfying is the claim made in relation to the 1916 essay that Benjamin selects the story of Genesis as a useful 'literary' strategy. Stern likens this strategy to Wittgenstein's famous metaphor of a 'ladder' that can be thrown away once its insights have been assimilated. Without this particular ladder, however, crucial aspects of Benjamin's theory of language would be incomprehensible; and the chosen metaphor, with its assumption of dispensable scaffolding, is not suitable here. According to Stern, Benjamin seeks 'a middle way' (49) between the designative theory of language and the mystical approach. This is the principle of Stern's mapping of the complex linguistic topography of the 1916 essay. The middle way, which Stern terms 'aesthetic', eschews the arbitrariness of the designative conception of words as without 'intrinsic connection to the objects that they name' (49), and rejects, too, the mystical approach, which sees in '"the word . . . simply the essence of the thing"' (49, cites Benjamin). There are, as Stern notes, various tiers of language in the 1916 essay. He characterises Benjamin's position as placing human language on 'a continuum between something like an aesthetic essence of the thing and an arbitrary marker for it' (50). Note that Stern inserts 'aesthetic' before Benjamin's phrase 'essence of the thing'. However, in Benjamin's essay, Adamic naming language in imitation of God's creative word is eminently cognitive, which means that it allows 'man' to take possession of nature. This cognitive status, and its intent, risks being overlooked and thus unaccounted by Stern's chosen vocabulary of 'aesthetic expression'.

In the 1916 essay, Stern writes:

[the] Bible is cited . . . as a narrative ladder that provides an initial framework for discussing the nature of language, but which can be afterwards thrown away without losing any of the insights that have been gained. . . . [Benjamin] uses it for its literary productivity, not because it contains, even in coded form, the truth about language. (51)

Stern acknowledges that the difficulties of using the story of Genesis in this manner are 'compounded by the fact that Benjamin does not make a clear delineation between the narrative and his own theory' (51). One might assume that the absence of this delineation should count against the proposed approach. For Stern, it is 'difficult', but 'not impossible, for the reader to distinguish Benjamin's theses from the story of the Fall' (51-2). In his detailed explanation of Benjamin's theory of language, it is primarily the theological status of God's creative word that Stern is keen to assign to literary strategy. The absence of a 'clear delineation' between the Genesis story and Benjamin's theory may find a simpler explanation were we to accept that, on Scholem's account, Benjamin did not understand the concept of God's word metaphorically.[2] Indeed, if the theological pivot of criticism was intended to be thrown away like Wittgenstein's ladder, we might wonder at its persistence in Benjamin's writing up until 1925, even without the trappings of the Genesis story, and indeed throughout his career.

Stern does not discuss Benjamin's 'Goethe's Elective Affinities' (GEA). It would have been interesting to see how Stern treated this essay, which in my view constitutes a formidable challenge for Stern's thesis. Benjamin considered the essay one of his most significant works.[3] Written between 1919-1921 and published in two instalments in 1924-5, it is contemporaneous with the early texts that Stern's book examines. This essay builds on the conceptual foundation of the essay on language and its basic opposition of nature and the word. The creative word of God is identified in the 1916 essay as the essence or truth of nature's forms accessible as 'knowledge' to human beings in their naming language. GEA uses this theory of language to diagnose the feelings of anxiety and guilt that characterise the bourgeois life. According to Benjamin, this existential state has its cause in the receding tide of tradition, which is replaced with 'free choice'. Bourgeois free choice is governed by arbitrary, merely aesthetic criteria. Benjamin identifies such arbitrariness in naming conventions that select names based on aesthetic features such as their 'pleasing sounds'. He similarly condemns the arbitrary status of chattering language when it is cut off from the cognitive status of language in God's creative word. The merely 'aesthetic' life, which sees potential significance and meaning everywhere and inserts nature's forms into this mythic frame, is the target of Benjamin's criticism. The theological language of the essay ('alone with God' [4]) is not a religious trapping. Only a theological perspective allows humans to dispel the demonic semblance of mere nature ('chaos of symbols' (GEA, 315)) where meaning is ambiguous and deceptive. Thus, Benjamin chooses the term 'expressionless' for the theological perspective that he sets against aesthetic 'semblance'. The position is specifically directed against the 'bourgeois' idolatry of beauty and of works of art.

Benjamin describes the semblance of beauty as a 'false totality,' which is shattered into shards by the 'sublime violence' and 'truth' of the expressionless [das Ausdruckslos] (GEA, 340). By the term 'semblance' Benjamin understands the seduction of beautiful appearances. The expressionless is the 'moral dictum' that mortifies the shimmering totality of appearances. True love, which Benjamin presents as an antidote to the semblance of beauty, requires an unconditional faith in God: 'Love becomes perfect only where, elevated above its nature, it is saved through God's intervention' (GEA, 344-45). The essay is pitched against the mythicizing cult around Goethe in the George school. He casts human life as the work of 'the Creator' that 'cannot be considered on the analogy of a work of art' (GEA, 325). It is for this reason that the presentation of Goethe as a hero-type by his acolytes casts a 'spell' that 'separates him from the moral uniqueness of responsibility. For [on their reading] he is not alone before his god; rather, he is the representative of mankind before its gods' (GEA, 322). One must admit that it is very difficult to square the fundamental position and conceptual architecture of the essay on Goethe's novel with Stern's thesis that theological language in Benjamin is a strategy or disposable metaphor. It looks to me that in Benjamin's opposition of the 'expressionless' and 'semblance', and all that this opposition implies, we rather have a clear proof of his antagonism to a position like 'aesthetic expressivism'.

Stern does not examine the extent of the influence of the messianic tradition and Jewish mysticism on Benjamin's thinking. The point is important from the perspective of Stern's thesis that aesthetic expressivism is Benjamin's response to scientific disenchantment. The epistemological foundation of Benjamin's philosophy is theological. The 'expressivist' idea that 'everything is meaningful' would have been anathema to the author of the essay on Goethe's novel. In Benjamin's writing, truth is fundamentally transcendent, the caesura that breaks through totalising images of nature or history. The place of the transcendent truth in Benjamin gives way in Stern's account to the idea that language expresses meaning that is ubiquitous and immanent. But this is precisely the Goethean view of the 'infinite living realm' revealed through the 'voice' of nature which Benjamin calls 'myth', and which he singles out for criticism in GEA in the following terms: 'In this world view lies chaos. To that pass at last leads the life of the myth, which, without master or boundaries, imposes itself as the sole power in the domain of existence' (GEA, 316).

Language is eminently cognitive in Benjamin's work, whether in the early language essay or in the later writing on history. In his later writing Benjamin tries to reconcile his notion of truth as a transcendent intervention (a 'caesura') with history through notions such as the dialectical image. In the Arcades Project, for instance, the universal human wish for emancipation as the truth of history is given experience-able form in the dialectical images constructed from the marginal figures of the nineteenth century. The wish for emancipation has oneiric and hence distorted forms in the century. The dialectical image which embodies the wish 'awakens' the dreaming collective into a revolutionary community. Benjamin's theory of history preserves the theological moment: the revolutionary moment is the absolute irruption of historical continuum and the revelation of truth. The semantic thoroughness (truth) of the naming language also characterizes the dialectical image: its experience-able content is thoroughly possessed by the subject insofar as the subject undergoes the content. Thus, it is also formative of a concrete humanity through collective experience, i.e., a (universal) humanity that is not merely an ideal.

When language is cast in 'aesthetic' terms that 'express' meaning rather than convey truth or knowledge, the theory of language becomes nebulous and less interesting. Benjamin explicitly criticises and rejects the idea of an 'immanent' expressivity in GEA. Stern says that Benjamin refuses 'to countenance a lack of meaning anywhere' (330). If by 'meaning' meaningful experience is understood here, that is to say, reconciliation with human beings and nature -- this is precisely the issue that Benjamin addresses. The solution, however, does not consist in an aesthetics of the expressivity of the world, but in the revolutionary (collective) experience forged in the dialectical image. This experience is necessarily historical, that is, it is the remembrance of a specific moment of history, i.e., the mid nineteenth century. Benjamin's theory of history is not at all a hermeneutic of human experience in general. In GEA he criticises Goethe's adoption late in his life of an all-embracing symbolic attitude to phenomena, which he thus loads with the depth of indeterminate spiritual meaning. According to Benjamin, Goethe built a mythic world on his earlier fascination with nature. Goethe's attitude, Benjamin argues, necessarily leads to fear and anxiety.[5]

Stern is quite uneven in his selection and treatment of Benjamin's writings. His book is nearly 400 pages long, but he discusses in detail only three of Benjamin's works: his 1916 essay on language; the 1925 'Epistemo-Critical Foreword'; and the 1919 dissertation On the Concept of Criticism in German Romanticism. To be sure, these are difficult texts that warrant close attention. Stern claims that his interpretation fits a number of other works, such as Benjamin's essay on the Artwork and the Arcades Project. The dividing line between Benjamin's writing pre and post 1925 conventionally referred to in the scholarship is blurred and passed over in silence.

In many respects, the collected writings of Benjamin are unclassifiable. They are manifestly heterogeneous in topic and approach. Possible 'influences' tend to be distorted out of shape in his singular reception of them. Unsurprisingly, the scholarship has struggled to reach consensus on key issues of interpretation. Not least this is because discussions in the field are often conducted in silos with groups pursuing interpretations that are never tested against alternative perspectives, which is the usual practice of debate in other fields. The tell-tale symptom of this problem is the tendency to conduct one's discussion on the basis of a very limited number of works, wherein the interpretation may appear arguable only because it leaves out of consideration pertinent works that would contest it. Although it fits with Taylor's distinction between designative and expressive theories of language, Stern's convergence of Benjamin and Wittgenstein via the thesis of 'expressivity' aggravates further all the difficulties involved in the interpretation of each. When we consider that Stern's thesis of 'aesthetic expressivism' in effect ascribes to Benjamin a position he vehemently criticised, it is worth asking whether the gains in using this thesis warrant the losses.

[1] See Howard Eiland and Michael W. Jennings, Walter Benjamin: A Critical Life (Belknap Press: Harvard, 2014) on the history of the withdrawn Habilitation thesis, 359, 385-7, 521, 698, n.37.

[2] Scholem states that 'it was no cause of surprise for me', especially from the tenor of a number of letters of the 1930s, that 'I never heard him [Benjamin] make an atheistic statement,' but 'it did surprise me that he could still speak quite unmetaphorically of "God's words," in distinction to human words, as the foundation for all linguistic theory.' Gershom Scholem, Walter Benjamin: The Story of a Friendship. Trans., Harry Zohn (New York, NY: New York Review of Books, 1981), 262.

[3] G. Scholem, Walter Benjamin: The Story of a Friendship, 184.

[4] Walter Benjamin, 'Goethe's Elective Affinities', Selected Writings, Volume 1: 1913-1926, edited by Marcus Bullock and Michael W. Jennings (Belknap Press of Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA, London, 1996), 297-361, 353.

[5] Benjamin cites Goethe's friend Georg Gottfried Gervinus who complained that Goethe had come to 'consider . . . the most miserable thing with the pathetic mien of the wisdom seeker' and that as he grows older his 'mental disposition' is 'to admire everything, to find everything 'significant, marvelous, incalculable'', GEA, 319.