The Fifth Corner of Four: An Essay on Buddhist Metaphysics and the Catuṣkoṭi

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Graham Priest, The Fifth Corner of Four: An Essay on Buddhist Metaphysics and the Catuṣkoṭi, Oxford University Press, 2018, 172pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198758716.

Reviewed by Mark Siderits, Seoul National University (Emeritus)


This is a book about the catuṣkoṭi or tetralemma, a device used by some classical Indian philosophers and then exported to China in Buddhist shipping containers. Like its shorter cousin, the dilemma, the tetralemma purports to give all the possible stances one could take with respect to a proposition of the form 's is P'. But it has four points (koṭi) rather than just the two, affirmation and negation, of the dilemma, due to the addition of 'both' and 'neither'. Graham Priest follows the development of this device from its earliest Buddhist appearance, in certain of the Buddha's teachings, through its efflorescence in the Madhyamaka school of Indian Mahāyāna Buddhism, its role in Jain perspectivalism, and its place in the Hua Yen and Chan schools of East Asian Buddhism.

The addition of the third and fourth lemmas has occasioned much puzzlement among modern interpreters of these traditions. As Priest points out in Chapter 2, when interpreted by the canons of classical logic, the third and fourth lemmas are equivalent, and the first and second are entailed by the third (which also, having the form of a contradiction, entails every other proposition). Those familiar with Priest's work will not be shocked to learn that he thinks these difficulties are to be overcome by adopting a non-classical or deviant logic and using it to make room for the possibility of there being true contradictions. A first pass at this comes with his discussion of the Buddha's famous refusal to answer certain questions (the so-called 'indeterminate' or 'unanswered' questions): for each of these questions, the Buddha rejects, in turn, answers taking each of the four lemma-forms. Priest deploys the paraconsistent logic of first-degree entailment, in plurivalent form, in order to make sense of the tetralemma as a putatively exhaustive scheme. Priest does not, though, take up the question how the Buddha might have thought to get away with rejection of all four lemmas, until he has sketched the development of Abhidharma Buddhist metaphysics (Chapter 3) and the Madhyamaka rejection of Abhidharma's ontological foundationalism (Chapter 4). This leads, in Chapter 5, to the introduction of a fifth truth-value beyond the four already introduced (true, false, both, and neither) and its deployment (Chapter 6) in aid of resolving the paradox of ineffability that Priest locates in the Madhyamaka doctrine of emptiness. The chapter also has a discussion of Jain perspectivalism, the view that there are altogether seven basic stances one may take toward a given predication. (It is Jain perspectivalism that is illustrated by the famous parable of the elephant and the seven blind men.) The next three chapters discuss developments in the East Asian Buddhist schools of Hua Yen and Chan. The final chapter is a brief methodological coda discussing the sorts of pitfalls that a project of this sort is subject to, and the ways in which Priest believes he has avoided them. There are also several technical appendices spelling out the formalisms employed, and establishing some results.

Priest acknowledges at the outset (xvii) that he is no scholar of the Buddhist philosophical tradition, so that he must rely on the translations of others to support his interpretations of that tradition's texts. He is also well aware that many of his readings will be rejected by scholars with the relevant expertise, though he suspects that in many cases this is due to ignorance concerning developments in paraconsistent logics. He insists, though, that his job is not to produce interpretations of the texts that meet all the standards of scholarly rigor. It is instead to take ideas he finds in these texts and employ tools of modern logic in order to analyze, articulate and evaluate them (149). As he points out, this is something we do unhesitatingly with the philosophical texts of ancient Greece and medieval Europe. Not only does such engagement with other ways of doing philosophy enhance our understanding of the tradition in question, it may also, Priest points out (149), lead to new insights on our own side. This is no neo-colonialist project of cultural appropriation.

Given these many disclaimers, it is difficult to find fault with a project having such laudable aims. Still, it is not just lack of familiarity with the techniques of non-classical logics that may be behind the widespread conviction among scholars of Buddhist philosophy that no Indian Buddhist philosopher would have agreed that there can be true contradictions. Priest has set out to show how a multi-valued logic of first-degree entailment may be used to shed light on what philosophers like Nāgārjuna, Candrakīrti, Fazang and Dōgen were up to. The exercise may lose some (though not all) of its significance if it turns out that Nāgārjuna et al. did not say many of the things Priest takes them to have said. In the remainder of this review I shall survey some of the evidence that they did not. I do this with some trepidation, since any effort to initiate dialogue between western and Asian philosophical traditions is commendable. Still if this is to be a dialogue, care must be taken to ensure that there is a real conversational partner on the other side of the table.

I begin with the tetralemma itself, and specifically the interpretation of the third ('both') and fourth ('neither') lemmas. Mādhyamikas use the tetralemma form in attempting to refute the views of their opponents. Given the various ways in which statements of the third 'both' form are rejected in Madhyamaka texts, it is not always easy to see how this form should be read. For often (e.g., Mūlamadhyamakakārika [hereafter MMK] 1.1-2, MMK 21.13) a statement of this form is dismissed on the grounds that it inherits all the faults of statements of the relevant first and second lemma-forms, statements that were earlier subjected to refutation. This thus leaves open the possibility that a statement of this form is meant to be a contradiction. But in MMK 27.17, where the question is whether the person in this life is identical with or distinct from the reborn person in the next life, the commentators explicate the third lemma as the claim that they are identical qua person but distinct qua person-stage. Parameterization is likewise at work in the third-lemma statement concerning whether cause and effect are identical or distinct. At Madhyamakāvatāra 6.98, Candrakīrti identifies this view as that of a Jain perspectivalist (anekāntavādin), who claims that in one respect (viz. in virtue of the cause being the stuff out of which the effect is produced) they are identical, while in another respect (viz. cause and effect being temporally separate) they are distinct. Those who deploy theses of this form are not asserting contradictions.

As for theses taking the form of the fourth lemma, these are regularly glossed as asserting that the matter at hand is inexpressible. For instance, in commenting on MMK 22.4, the commentator Bhāviveka says the position under investigation -- that the Buddha is neither identical with nor distinct from the psychophysical elements -- is that of the Personalists, who are known for their view that the relation between a person and the psychophysical elements is indeterminate or inexpressible. Likewise, the claim (MMK 22.11) that the Buddha is neither empty nor non-empty is identified by the commentator Candrakīrti as that of the Yogācāra school, which holds that the nature of whatever is ultimately real (including the Buddha) is inexpressible.

Returning, then, to the Buddha's rejection of each of the four lemmas with respect to certain matters, there is no need to invoke non-classical logic to see how this might be coherent. Where the Buddha's refusal to answer a question is not based on strictly pragmatic grounds (as in the question whether the world is infinite in extent or not, something presumably irrelevant to attaining liberation), the question is posed in tetralemma form, e.g. at Majjhima Nikāya 72: Is an enlightened person reborn after death, not reborn, both, or neither? All four questions share the presupposition that there is such a thing as the enlightened person, someone who might take one of four possible post-mortem states. The Buddha's response is that since this presupposition is false, none of the four answers is assertible. (Or, as the early Buddhist sūtras put the point, each involves hypostatization; see Aṅguttara Nikāya II.161.) The presupposition fails because, given the Buddhist doctrines of mereological nihilism and momentariness, the term 'person' turns out to be strictly speaking without meaning. Priest objects (29) that if the view is that a non-existent person can be said to be neither reborn nor not reborn, this amounts to the fourth lemma. This misses the point that the fourth lemma presupposes the existence of the subject s as something to which the predicate P simply has no application. The Buddha's rejection of all four lemmas is based on the defensible assumption that statements with false presuppositions lack meaning, and thus lack truth value (whether it be one of the classical two or the plurivalent many). Were the borogoves mimsy, not mimsy, both, or neither?

The Buddha's treatment of questions posed in tetralemma form set the stage for the later development of the Madhyamaka system. As Priest makes clear, the Madhyamaka claim that all things are empty or devoid of intrinsic nature represents their rejection of the Abhidharma schools' ontological foundationalism. For Abhidharma, ultimate states of affairs are composed of simples whose natures are intrinsic. Mādhyamikas hold that there can be no such things; in support, they subject various Abhidharma theories about these simples to refutation, often using the tetralemma framework. The question is what this would show. Given Madhyamaka acceptance of the claim that composite objects are not ultimately real, it might seem to result either in metaphysical nihilism (the second lemma) or else in the view that the ultimate nature of reality is ineffable (the fourth lemma). But taking their cue from the Buddha's treatment of the question about the fate of an enlightened being, they simply deny the intelligibility of the notion of an ultimate nature of reality. We see this at work, for instance, at MMK 25.21-3, where there is explicit invocation of presupposition failure in defense of the rejection of all four lemmas with respect to nirvāna's being an existent.

Priest takes the Madhyamaka doctrine that all things are devoid of intrinsic nature to commit Mādhyamikas to the ineffability of reality (60-1). And this commitment, he believes, lands them in the paradox of ineffability, since one is saying something about ('effing') the ultimate nature of reality when one says it is ineffable. But he takes them not to have sought to resolve the paradox, but rather to have embraced the resulting contradiction (83) -- hence the suitability of applying a paraconsistent logic to their view. The difficulty with this reading is that Mādhyamikas regularly work to avoid committing the paradox of ineffability themselves, and use the paradox as a tool with which to criticize others. Bhāviveka, for instance, deploys the paradox as the basis of an objection to the rival Yogācāra's schools claim that the ultimate reals are inexpressible in nature. Perhaps Priest will object that this is no more than an ad hominem deployed against opponents who themselves accept the principle of non-contradiction, and that as such this is perfectly consistent with Madhyamaka's purported dialetheism. This is precisely his strategy (85) when confronted with the fact that Candrakīrti calls those who contradict themselves madmen (unmattaka) and not to be spoken to (Prasannapadā 15). I leave it to others to judge the strength of this strategy for disarming Candrakīrti's denunciation of those of his opponents who contradict themselves. But in the chapter on nirvāna, Candrakīrti explicitly rejects the claim that nirvāna is ineffable, since that claim rests on the false presupposition that nirvana is ultimately real, something with intrinsic nature (MMK 25.10-15). And Bhāviveka uses the paradox of ineffability as a reason to reject the fourth lemma with respect to the claim that things are ultimately empty (MMK 22.11). Ineffability claims land us in paradox precisely because they require that there be something we can say they are about. No such paradoxes arise when it comes to the borogoves.

My criticisms have been aimed at Priest's interpretations of the Buddhist texts, not with what he does with those interpretations. Were there no gap between his readings and an admissible interpretation of the elements of Buddhist philosophy he engages with, this work would count as a real tour de force. It is indeed of considerable interest that the set of ideas he attributes to Buddhist philosophers might be systematized in so tidy a package. The worry is just that some readers might take this to be a plausible representation of Buddhist ideas.

As was pointed out earlier, Priest is quite open about the fact that he lacks the scholarly credentials to study the Buddhist philosophical tradition as preserved in the textual corpus. This should not be a bar to engaging in the sorts of explorations found here. At this stage in the modern study of the history of Buddhist philosophy, mastery of at least several of the relevant languages may well be necessary. But there are reasons to study the tradition other than the desire to get the history right. One is that when two independent traditions use similar methods to work on similar issues, it is always possible that one may have hit on approaches that the other missed. Another is that the decentering that can be induced by looking at another tradition may trigger fresh insights, even if those insights are not ones that were actually developed by the tradition marked 'other'. Indeed, it might be said that just such decentering occurred when Buddhist thought came to China from India, yet we still think of East Asian Buddhist thought as Buddhist. Perhaps something similar might be said about Priest's 'reconstruction' of the tetralemma in Asian Buddhist philosophy.