The Figural Jew: Politics and Identity in Postwar French Thought

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Sarah Hammerschlag, The Figural Jew: Politics and Identity in Postwar French Thought, University of Chicago Press, 2010, 298pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226315126.

Reviewed by Jonathan Judaken, Rhodes College


Sarah Hammerschlag's The Figural Jew offers an insightful new interpretation of how a cluster of postwar French thinkers (Jean-Paul Sartre, Emmanuel Levinas, Maurice Blanchot, and Jacques Derrida) represented Jews and Judaism in their thought. To do so, she zeros in on the figure of the wandering Jew. Ahasverus, an icon of the medieval Christian imagination, is a peripatetic wanderer whose rejection of Christ dooms him to roam the earth until the Second Coming. The Wandering Jew embodies the figure of the Jew as nomad, stranger, outsider: the uprooted. As such, Ahasverus represents the antithesis of the French nation. This is true for both the universalist Republican legacy of the enlightenment that emancipated Jews in the French Revolution and for the integral nationalist tradition that stems from Maurice Barrès and Charles Maurras.

Hammerschlag seeks to explain how, over the course of postwar French thought, the trope of the wandering Jew, which once served as a quintessentially anti-Semitic icon, was revalorized. Here is her narrative in a nutshell: it began with Sartre's celebration of an existentialist conception of Self as diasporic. Levinas buttressed this notion with a moral gloss. Blanchot gave Levinas a literary twist that emphasized the figurative elements of the trope. Derrida then gave full play to the self-conscious tropological deployment of the Jew.

By each of these turns of thought, Hammerschlag teases out a tradition of French reflections that critique both the exclusionary nationalism of the Right and the assimilatory nationalism of French Republicanism. By her conclusion, Hammerschlag herself embraces the figural Jew as an image of what Phillipe Lacoue-Labarthe callsdéfigurisation: a poetic figure that "crosses the figure out or exposes it in the negative" (14). The significance of what this rather hermetic formulation entails for conceptions of community are far reaching.

For Hammerschlag, there are three key aims to following the trail of the wandering Jew in postwar French thought: First, to show

how Sartre and Levinas mined the resources of anti-Semitism and exploited them in order to define an ideal that could be differentiated from both nostalgic nationalism and the rhetoric of universalizing humanism. What is generated in the process is a figural Jew, an archetype for a new kind of difference in particularity whose function is to suggest that there is a positive moral valence to resisting the discourse of belonging that dominates both the universalist and the particularist versions of political identity (18, emphasis added).

The second aim is to show that in the self-referentiality that figurative discourse entails -- that in pointing to Jews as figural -- Sartre, Levinas, Blanchot, and Derrida, along with their deconstructive ilk, avoid repeating the dynamics of exclusivity and anti-Semitism through their repetition of Jewish tropes. I will say more about this below.

But Hammerschlag's claim is that that each of the key figures she discusses was aware that the wandering Jews that they celebrate in their philosophical reflections are tropes or, as Hammerschlag's title suggests, "figural Jews." They seek to make their readers aware of this awareness. Missing this, she argues against the grain of much scholarly work in this area, is not only to misinterpret their considerations on the Jewish Question, but also to fail to appreciate the subversive potentiality of the figural Jew. This last point is the third aim of Hammerschlag's book.

Howeverit raises the question about its upshot for Jewish communal politics. Since the trajectory that Hammerschlag follows is critical of modes of collective belonging, especially those defined in the discourse of nationalism, one of her targets is Zionism. Implicated as well are unproblematized forms of Jewish religious collective belonging. While Hammerschlag's veneration of Blanchot and Derrida's "figural Jews" causes no qualms, how Sartre and Levinas thought about Israel, Zionism, and Jewish national liberation, as well as the rites and rituals of religious life, does raise some concerns about her reading of their works.

Before we consider that, let's set the stage for Hammerschlag's core chapters: those on Sartre (Chapter 2), Levinas (Chapter 3), Blanchot (Chapter 4), and Derrida (Chapter 5). The scaffolding for her argument is both conceptual and historical. Hammerschlag opens with the distinction made by Jean-Luc Nancy and Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe in "The Nazi Myth" between "myth" and "figure." Based on a reading of Alfred Rosenberg's The Myth of the Twentieth Century, Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe argue that myth is "a fiction, in the strong, active sense of 'fashioning' . . . whose role is to propose . . . types in imitation of which an individual, or a city, or an entire people, can grasp themselves and identify themselves" (12). Figurative language, on the other hand, "is defined by the fact that it is at a third remove from its proper referent, standing in for a word that is itself already a representation" (13).

In addition to this conceptual move, in her first chapter, "Roots, Rootlessness and Fin de Siècle France," Hammerschlag lays out the historical framework for the postwar conversation. In this chapter, we get a careful and rigorous reading of the figure of the Jew in the work of Barrès and his enemies: the supporters of Dreyfus, Bernard Lazare and Charles Péguy. Here the long anti-Semitic demarche followed by Ahasverus is traced, and the implications of this for the Dreyfus Affair are elucidated.

In Barrès' Culte du moi trilogy, and most emphatically in his 1897 novel Les déracinés, he constructed a "philosophy of roots" defined in opposition to "the uprooted" (read: wandering Jews). The shibboleths of Barrès' discourse about la patrie (the fatherland) were condensed in his formula la terre et les morts (the land and the dead). What unified the fatherland were roots, embedded in ancestral traditions, located in a particular terroir. The opposite of these Barrès insisted could be summarized in a word: "'The crowd always needs a word of war to rally itself; it wants some cry of passion that makes abstract ideas tangible . . . Juif is only an adjective designating usurers, monopolizers, stockbrokers, all that abuse money'" (36). In a sense, Barrès' own recognition -- that Juif named a set of associations based upon a history of the representation of Jews and Judaism and was thus a useful rallying cry -- ironically set the terms by which the signifier Juif could be revalorized.

Barrès' association of modernity, abstract rationalism, and the intellectual with Jews and Judaism meant that those identifying with these categories could embrace the term. As Hammerschlag puts it,

the fact that Barrès consistently shaped his image of the French race in his literary texts through the contrasting depiction of the barbarian or the foreigner, who was for him best exemplified by the Jew, gives the very values with which he associated the Jew a certain glint of goodness. These qualities include intellective reflection, rootlessness, anxiety, and a certain dis-ease in one's environment (41).

Indeed, Lazare, the first of the Dreyfusards, accepted the racial terms of Barrès' position in his advocacy of a novel form of cultural Zionism. "There are indeed, 'Jewish types,'" Lazare assented. But Lazare gave this the twist that defined him as a "conscious pariah," according to Hannah Arendt. For Lazare, what Jews share in common is subjection to oppression. This joined him to other cultural nationalists like W.E.B du Bois and Aimé Césaire.

Hammerschlag notes,

Bernard Lazare's goal was clearly noble and the vision of the Jew as an emblem for the downtrodden and the oppressed was a powerful one that invested the Jewish condition with moral significance. It provided for the first time the possibility for revalorization, a revalorization that for the first time seemingly would not necessitate an abnegation of Jewish history and Jewish values. It did, however, involve siding with the anti-Semites by rejecting one of the dominant Jewish stereotypes of the moment and, in that sense, still seemed determined by the anti-Semitic portrait of the Jew (52).

Lazare's image of the Jewish pariah consequently accepted an essentialist representation of Jews that shared features in common with Barrès. In Lazare's case, his affirmation of a Jewish race was wedded to his cultural Zionism, which nonetheless was at odds with the political narrative constructed by Theodor Herzl and the other dominant figures of the early Zionist movement. Hammerschlag next discusses how Péguy's heroization of Lazare cemented an image of him as the embodiment of Jewish pariahdom. In short, Péguy's Notre jeunesse, his ode to the Dreyfusard cause, cast Lazare in the role of a "modern-day Ahasverus" (54).

With this theoretical and historical backdrop, Hammerschlag develops the argumentative core of the book, which is to trace out the valorization of the wandering Jew in postwar ruminations on the Jewish Question. Rather than go step by step through the dense textual readings she offers of Sartre, Levinas, Blanchot, and Derrida that make up the bulk of her work, let's focus on some problems for her argument.

Hammerschlag rightly praises the central strand of Sartre's Réflexions, which argues that Jewishness is represented

as an intensification of the existentialist's choice. The Jew is rootless; he is a stranger; he is defined and determined by the gaze of the other. The existentialist hero embraces his circumstances and the freedom and responsibility that exist therein. He does not flee; he chooses and engages. The Jew, as the stranger, as a 'type who has nothing, no homeland,' has a function like Kafka's hero (93).

To her detriment, however, Hammerschlag does not consider Sartre's long and sustained defense of Zionism and Israel. From 1948 through to his final days, Sartre was an articulate defender of Zionism as a Jewish liberation movement. In one of many statements that make the same point again and again, he wrote:

I will never abandon this constantly threatened country [Israel] whose existence ought not to be put into question. . . . I know that my stance earns me the enmity of certain Arabs who cannot understand that one is able to be at the same time for Israel and for them (Jean-Paul Sartre, "Ce que Jean-Paul Sartre avait dit à 'Tribune Juive'").

Sartre laid the philosophical ground for this position in his Réflexions sur la questions juive, where he insisted that Zionism represented one form of Jewish authenticity. Wrote Sartre in Anti-Semite and Jew:

he may also be led by his choice of authenticity to seek the creation of a Jewish nation [nation juive] possessing its own soil and autonomy; he may persuade himself that Jewish authenticity demands that the Jew [Juif] be sustained by a Jewish national community [communauté israélite].

Does not the stance that Sartre took on Israel and Zionism force us to question Hammerschlag's reading of the figural Jew in his work? It certainly makes us pause when Hammerschlag contends that other tensions in Sartre, for example, the long scholarly discussion about how he occasionally repeats anti-Semitic tropes in his Anti-Semite and Jew are based on a misunderstanding of the arc of his work.[1]

A similar complaint can be made about her interpretation of Levinas. Since what Levinas presents for Hammerschlag is "a philosophy of uprootedness" (119), she is critical of the ambivalence in Levinas' own position on the State of Israel (see 161, for example). She is troubled as well by the legacy of some of his followers, like Benny Lévy, whose Judaism was defined by a return to orthodox forms of communal ritual observance (see 163, for example).

Lévy complained in his last work, Être juif, that Levinas had too often emphasized the universalist trace in his writings about Jews. Part of what attracted Lévy, the former leader of the French Maoists, to Levinas's thought was his references to the authority of the Talmud and Halachah (Jewish Law) in his Jewish writings. Clearly entailed by this form of Judaism (in all its permutations) is communal observance: the daily ritual life of Jewish prayer, the shared study of Jewish texts, holy days, and adherence to the ceremonies of the Jewish life cycle.

To cite only one reference of countless in which Levinas calls for revivifying Jewish communal life, we can turn to his essay, "How is Judaism Possible?" In it, he surveys a set of communal institutions that can help revitalize the Jewish community, including new types of Jewish schools, youth movements, Jewish studies in the academy, yeshivot integrated into a Jewish higher-education system, and the State of Israel as a prod to Jewish community building:

The community needs truths that generate life. It needs a doctrinal and philosophical teaching that can be given on the level of cultivated minds. This teaching . . . can be created only by the community itself. It must be sustained, if need be provoked, at all events co-ordinated and unified. Pluralist tendencies do not exclude the unity of the institution in which they might be grouped ("How is Judaism Possible? in Difficult Liberty, 251).

How then do these twin issues of Sartre's and Levinas' defense of Israel and Zionism, coupled with Levinas' advocacy of Jewish communal life sustained by rabbinic Judaism square with Hammerschlag's rendition of the story of the figural Jew? Clearly Sartre and Levinas were both advocates of modes of Jewish communal life that do not always neatly tear apart the mythic and the figurative. The power of Hammerschlag's exploration of the figural Jew in Blanchot and Derrida is to insist that those who speak in the name of Jews and Judaism do not veer into the dangerous essentialism that shadows community building through venerated myths. This is an insightful supplement to the positions taken by Sartre and Levinas, but a more direct confrontation with these tensions seems warranted.

Glossing these incongruities, in the end, Hammerschlag hangs her hat on a specific deconstructive trajectory that her book rightly celebrates:

First appearing in Blanchot's texts, and later developed in various directions by Derrida, Jean-François Lyotard, Jean-Luc Nancy, Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe, and Georgio Agamben are visions of community that refuse both the universalizing and the particularizing options. What all these figures have inherited from Blanchot is a resistance to and suspicion of communal fusion, a suspicion, that is, of the modes of identification that bind people to a group, whether through territory, language, culture or ethnicity (263).

Blanchot perhaps came to his position through his own reflections on his involvement with far right wing publications in the 1930s. This was an involvement that he atoned for in subsequent years. But Hammerschlag doesn't raise this specter of Blanchot's career. Indeed, much of the biographical and historical context aside from that discussed in her first chapter only appears in the footnotes of The Figural Jew. The risk is that her radically immanent readings, attentive to the deconstructive thrust of her argument, miss the contextual specifics that led Sartre and Levinas to make the claims in their work that augur against Hammerschlag's reading of that work.

Indeed, without the broader context as an indicator of how writers understand the meaning of the word Juif, I remain unsure about how one disentangles the mythic from the figurative use of images of Jews and Judaism. Barrès clearly recognized that the Jew in his texts were "figural." He was aware that "Jew" or "Jewish" could be deployed as an adjective that embodied a whole complex of forces. He said so. The texts of Shakespeare and Augustine and St. Paul suggest the same thing. So whether writers recycle myths about Jews and Judaism or creatively disrupt these figures of exclusion depends a great deal on not only what they said, but also how they said it, and crucially in what contextual frame.

Thus when Hammerschlag references "interpreters of Sartre" who have failed to appreciate Sartre's role in helping to flip the script on the figure of the Jew in French thought, I am not sure this is the case. What Hammerschlag misses, however, is the anomaly that perplexes some of those interpreters. What in the body of Sartre's thought enabled him to both critique racial essentialism and reiterate anti-Semitic tropes of Jews and Judaism? How could the thinker whose core insight is "existence precedes essence" himself trot out essentialist stereotypes of Jews and Judaism? Is this something within Sartre's thought specifically, or in the context in which he makes his utterances, or does it carry over to a longer intellectual tradition that Sartre echoes? These questions posed by Sartre's work could be carried over to what critics have written about Blanchot or about thinkers treated only peripherally by Hammerschlag, like Lyotard, who are central to postmodern reflections on Jews and Judaism.

To flag these questions is to celebrate the issues that Hammerschlag asks us to reconsider. Her book merits celebration as well for how she brings Sartre, Blanchot, and Derrida into dialogue with Levinas and into conversation with a tradition of Jewish philosophers. The references to Herman Cohen, Franz Rosenzweig, and Steven Schwartzschild mean that Hammerschlag has shown how French Jewish thought, including that by non-Jews like Sartre and Blanchot, interestingly stretch the boundaries of Jewish thought itself. As such, The Figural Jew makes an important contribution to scholarship on Jewish philosophy, the study of Jews and Judaism in French culture, as well as to a minoritarian vein of intellectual history so taken with Jewish questions.

[1] See Jonathan Judaken, Jean-Paul Sartre and the Jewish Question: Anti-antisemitism and the Politics of the French Intellectual, Nebraska, 2006, chapters 4 and 8.