The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle

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Charles Batteux, The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle, James O. Young (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2015, 151pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198747116.

Reviewed by Theodore Gracyk, Minnesota State University Moorhead


Charles Batteux published Les Beaux Arts réduits à un même principe in 1746. It is something of a puzzle why we have had to wait more than two and a half centuries for an English translation of the full book. Its belated appearance should be welcomed by philosophers of art who conduct their scholarship in English, for it is a document of genuine historical importance. Better yet, translator James O. Young adds an illuminating introduction of more than 50 pages to Batteux's short book. For philosophers of art who are not immersed in eighteenth-century French philosophy, the resulting volume fills a major gap in our access to a liminal moment in the emergence of philosophy of art.

The primary significance of Batteux's monograph is widely acknowledged. It is the first attempt to offer an explicit definition of the fine arts ("beaux arts") and to explain how the fine arts possess a unifying principle that distinguishes them from arts more generally. Here, the fine arts are taken to be "music, poetry, painting, sculpture, and the art of gesture, or dance" (3).

Granted, the historical significance of Batteux's The Fine Arts is not comparable to that of Kant's Critique of Judgment. However, in France and Germany its influence might be comparable to the influence that Joseph Addison's 1712 essays on the pleasures of the imagination had upon the British tradition. Batteux's shadow is sufficiently long that Kant places him on the same footing as Lessing (in §33 of the Critique of Judgment). Did Kant study and draw on Batteux? Consider Kant's proposals that it is through genius that nature gives rules to art (§46), that genius on its own produces original nonsense (§46), and that taste must clip the wings of genius (§50). These are all Kantian variations on ideas expressed in Batteux's second chapter, such as Batteux's observation that "If genius capriciously assembles ideas in a manner that violates natural laws . . . [it] is reduced to a type of insanity" (5). There are certainly differences, as when Batteux endorses the longstanding view that genius is primarily an innate capacity to produce superior imitations. However, Young is right to call attention to several other parallels between Kant and Batteux (xxxi) and to emphasize Batteux's importance to Moses Mendelssohn and J. G. Herder (xxxii-xxxiii). For these and many other reasons, a good translation of Batteux merits our attention.

In defining the fine arts, Batteux famously proposes that they differ from the mechanical and other arts in being "essentially imitations of belle nature" (lxxx) "whose principal goal is [our] pleasure" (4). So fine art is essentially representational, and it always aims at providing pleasure. Taken at face value, this definition faces numerous problems. For example, it appears to bring well-written historical texts into the fold of fine art. In straightforward English, "belle nature" translates as "beautiful nature," so it would seem that descriptions of virtuous actions qualify as appropriate subjects for artistic representation. So some historical writings seem to fall under the proposed definition. However, Batteux explicitly rejects this overlap. Citing Aristotle's Poetics, he separate literatures from historical writing (11).

More generally, a literal translation of Batteux's definition seems to say that fine art is produced only when an artist locates something beautiful in nature and imitates it. So he also appears to ban unpleasant subject matter from fine art. Although that is far from his meaning, such implications may be a reason that he has not been taken very seriously by later philosophers of art who've lacked access to the larger text.

To avoid the unfortunate implications that adhere to a literal translation, Young wisely avoids translating the phrase "belle nature." He leaves it intact throughout the book so that it functions as a technical term that receives its meaning only through engagement with the surrounding doctrines of nature, imitation, genius, and taste. The advantage of this approach is to avoid misconceptions that must inevitably follow constant repetition of a misleading phrase. At the same time, we are also spared the awkwardness that arises from coining something new that departs from Batteux's infelicitous French phrase.

It turns out that "imitations of belle nature" are beautiful representations of idealized nature. For Batteux, the artist does not succeed through accurate representation, but rather through imaginative departure from observed nature. One of the clearest descriptions of the artificiality and creativity inherent in the imitation of belle nature arrives very late in the book, as Batteux takes up the topic of painting: "taste guides the artist in the choice, organization, and mixing of the large and small elements [of their works]" (125). The same is true in poetry, music, and dance, which are the other arts he treats as test cases for his theory. (After its initial appearance, Batteux gives sculpture short shrift.) In order to qualify as art, even the seemingly direct emotional expression of lyric poetry must be shaped by organization and selection. It is never a direct expression of emotion but rather "an accurate representation of well-chosen and well-organized objects" (123). The germ of a work of art may be a representation of some particular scene, emotion, or event, but if the artist does not "choose and perfect" them (20), the result is history, not art (7, 11, 123).

Consequently, the bulk of Batteux's monograph is devoted to the twin topics of how the various arts imitate, and why their various modes of imitation give us pleasure. For example, if pleasure is fine art's primary purpose, then he owes us an explanation of why tragedy is pleasurable. And he offers one (47-48). As with many accounts of art in the eighteenth century, poetry is the central art form for examination. By far, the longest segment of the book is Part Two, Section One, in which Batteux canvasses poetry and its six species (ranging from epics to fables). It is followed by a section on painting. Batteux observes that all he has said about poetry and its composition holds true for painting. We reach the end of the first page of the section on painting (125), we turn the page, and we find he has nothing more to say on the topic! Things immediately improve when he turns to music and dance, offering an account of music as imitation that moves the listener's emotions. Young's introduction highlights the importance of these final chapters; I would call attention to Batteux's argument against the intelligibility and value of non-expressive music (135-138). It provides a brief but articulate statement of the issues with instrumental music that will bedevil the aesthetics of music for the remainder of that century.

Young supplements his translation of Batteux's text with excellent supporting materials. I have already mentioned the generous length of the introduction, which provides context and some amount of interpretation. I am not fully persuaded that Batteux defends aesthetic cognitivism, which Young characterizes as the view "that works of art are, in an important way, sources of knowledge" (xxxviii). It is certainly true that Batteux sees some art as a source of knowledge. It is less clear that Batteux thinks that the expression of emotion through instrumental music rises to that level. However, that is the great virtue of having a good translation of the whole book: we are better able to decide for ourselves what doctrines are present.

The introductory material also includes a short biography, suggestions for further reading, and a summary of Young's goal as a translator. The goal is "a complete, accurate, and annotated English edition" (lxviii). For the most part, it is translated very literally. (But not always, for Young observes that that would leave us with too many obscurities.) The translated text is peppered with excellent footnotes, which serve three purposes. A good number offer explanations of Batteux's numerous references to other writers, many of whom are now obscure. Young makes no effort to guess which historical figures will be familiar to readers and which unfamiliar, so Socrates and Aristarchus receive equal treatment in explanatory notes. Second, we receive translations of Batteux's numerous quotations from classical authors, poets, and others, along with clear documentation of the sources. Third, Young alerts us to Batteux's less direct borrowings, as well as some unacknowledged borrowings from him by later writers. The only annotation that seems to be missing is a note to inform readers that the second of the five chapters of Section Three is from the revised edition of 1747; it was not included in the first edition of 1746, which is otherwise the source text.

Measured against Young's very reasonable goals, the translation is a great success. It is both readable and, so far as I can tell with the aid of a French dictionary, highly accurate. (Young acknowledges a number of people who checked his translation against the original.) Occasionally, a word jumped out at me and led me to check the original, and there are a few places where the translation might be more literal or consistent. For example, a chapter title uses "reality" to translate the French term "nature." The literal translation is "Genius must not imitate nature just as it is," but Young renders it as "Genius must not imitate reality just as it is" (11). Another page uses the phrase "artistic license" to capture Batteux's vague appeal to "rights" (13), and we have a reference to "sham taste" rather than the more literal "artificial taste" (32). Very occasionally, such choices may misdirect a reader. Given issues surrounding the meaning of the phrase "belle nature," I was surprised by Batteux's proposal that taste determines whether "belle nature has been accurately imitated" (27). The notion of accuracy runs afoul of the idea of imitation advanced up to this point. For if we are not to imitate nature just as it is, and belle nature is a product of the artist's imagination, then where is the standard for accuracy that guides the audience's sense of taste? Consulting the French, we find that the sentence reads "la belle nature est bien imitée." A straightforward translation would be "well imitated." There is no implication of accuracy. Perhaps Young is thinking ahead to Chapter Five, where Batteux claims that perfect imitation requires both "exactitude and freedom" (45). But there, in the second general law of taste, accurate execution of the artist's models must be balanced by freedom, "at the expense" of this very accuracy. So the English line "belle nature has been accurately imitated" carries implications about belle nature that seem to depart from Batteux's meaning. Indeed, when "bien imitée" occurs again, in the discussion of the second law, Young translates it as "imitated well" (45). Similarly, Batteux's term "sentiment" is sometimes translated as "sense" (31) and sometimes as "feeling" (39) and it might have been better to choose a single, consistent term. However, these are quibbles about minor details.

Batteux's The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle is a text more rumored than read in recent years. Young has done a great service by providing this annotated translation.