The First Sense: A Philosophical Study of Human Touch

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Matthew Fulkerson, The First Sense: A Philosophical Study of Human Touch, MIT Press, 2014, 219pp. $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262019965.

Reviewed by John Schwenkler, Florida State University


This is a really interesting book that should help to overcome the relative neglect of touch as a subject in philosophical work on perception and sensory consciousness. There are many reasons for this neglect, but a main one is that -- as far as I can tell, anyway -- tactual awareness is very often dim and recessive, especially in comparison with sensory consciousness in more vivid, dominant modalities like sight and hearing. Moreover, as Matthew Fulkerson emphasizes in his opening chapter, our intuitive conception of touch comprises a lot of sensory elements that differ so much from one another that it can be hard to make out the relations among them, or to determine whether they form any truly unitary mode of perception. (For example, is bodily awareness part of touch, or something separate from it? How about the sensation of temperature, or certain forms of bodily pleasure and pain?) All this makes it hard to progress in understanding tactual perception through any "purely" phenomenological or otherwise introspective study. But as this book reveals, such methods can be enriched considerably if they look to the best experimental research on their subject, drawing on the many ways in which, as Fulkerson puts it, "facts about the functional and informational organization of sensory systems . . . illuminate the nature and content of sensory experience, and often in surprising ways" (p. 20).

A good example of this is the series of distinctions Fulkerson makes in his opening chapter between the different dimensions of tactual experience. Human touch is cutaneous when (as I would put it) it is solely a matter of having one's skin be touched by something, and haptic to the extent that cutaneous stimulation is integrated with motor feedback as one uses one's body to touch an object. It is active to the extent that it involves movement, either of oneself or of the object of touch relative to one's body, and passive otherwise; and active touch is controlled to the extent that the movements it involves are subject to one's voluntary guidance. Tactual perception is object-directed when focused on the features of external things, and body-directed when focused instead on one's own body. It is intensive when it concerns features that vary in a single dimension (such as hardness or temperature), in contrast with geometrical tactual perception of spatial features like shape and size. Touch is discriminative insofar as it aims to extract information about the world, and emotional when it has an affective dimension. It is a form of stereognosis insofar as its aim is perceptual, and of prehension to the extent that it plays a direct role in manipulating things in the environment. And tactual awareness and its differing elements can be explicit or implicit to varying degrees depending on how much they are the object of conscious attention. For my own part, though I'm not sure that all these divisions fall in exactly the right places (for example, I would prefer to collapse the active/passive and haptic/cutaneous distinctions), I find that they make it possible to reflect phenomenologically on the experience of touch much more fruitfully than I could before, by drawing my attention to complexities in tactual awareness that I'd previously overlooked, and setting up a framework within which such reflection can proceed.

Another such example, where Fulkerson is drawing even more directly on experimental research, is in the discussion in chapter 3 of the role of exploratory movement in touch. Following work by Susan Lederman and Roberta Klatzky (Lederman and Klatzky 1987; cf. Jones and Lederman 2006), Fulkerson distinguishes several different tactual exploratory procedures (EPs), or ways that bodily movements serve to aid haptic perception, each suited to the discovery of a certain range of features. Here are a few: the lateral motion of one's hand across a flat surface is a way to discover its texture; applying pressure to an object reveals how hard or soft it is; unsupported holding of an object helps to determine its weight; and contour following around the outside surface of a large object reveals its shape and orientation. Once again, these divisions are not beyond dispute, but they help to bring out aspects of tactual perception that can otherwise go unnoticed, and to systematize them in a way that makes it possible to reflect on them more productively.

The role of exploratory movement in touch is important to Fulkerson's overall position in a lot of ways. For example, in chapters 2 and 3 he argues that EPs are essential to the kind of sensory binding that's characteristic of tactual perception, and in virtue of which touch counts as a unitary sensory system. Fulkerson notes that in perceiving the various tangible features of (e.g.) a metal sphere that you hold in your hand -- its solidity, texture, temperature, shape, size, weight, and so on -- your experience of these features

does not seem, at least to introspection, to involve association between separate experiences. . . . There does not seem to be a separate kinesthetic experience independent and distinguishable from one [sic] pressure experience, both of which are different again from the thermal experience, and so forth. Instead, one has a unified experience with different constituent elements . . .  (p. 40)

And on his view, the reason why the different features of tactual experience are bound together in this way is that their being sensed is "a result of a specific act of perceptual exploration" (p. 48) -- here, the movement of your hand in relation to the sphere that helps to reveal its various features. In general, how we experience tactually perceived features as bound together into representations of objects

is a result of which exploratory actions we deploy. Haptic exploration unifies the signals coming from the distinct receptor populations, signaling that the disparate information coming from these different channels concerns the same object. It is through such exploration that the distinct features involved in touch are properly assigned to the objects around us. (pp. 48-49)

This analysis faces some difficulties, however. First, in all of the examples Fulkerson gives, the most obvious role of tactual exploration is that of making it possible to perceive the features of an object, and it is unclear how they also play the role of binding tactually perceived features into unitary object representations. Moreover, for the reasons I noted just above moving your hand in order to perceive the various features of a sphere isn't obviously a single act, as it encompasses a lot of different EPs. So why, then, doesn't this kind of heterogeneity in our exploratory movements lead to corresponding disunity in the objects to which these perceived features are assigned? By my lights, Fulkerson's account isn't sufficiently clear on this point either. Finally, Fulkerson seems to me to go wrong in the way he frequently suggests that the central role of exploratory movement is a distinctive characteristic of tactual perception, in contrast to vision especially. In one such passage he writes the following:

Exploring a visual feature seems to alter and augment all of the visual features together . . . . Whatever actions are involved in visual experiences, they do not at all serve the role played by EPs in touch. When we explore the world through touch, we do not simply move around and sample the environment; the movements alter and change our very receptor systems in such a way that we are able to experience particular sets of features in the world. When we lift an object and squeeze it to feel how hard or heavy it is, the action component is a part of the perceiving process (not merely feeding into it), but in a very specialized manner. (pp. 57-58)

But visual exploration is much richer and more multifaceted than this passage lets on. For example, here are a few of the exploratory practices common in visual perception: putting an object in different light in order to reveal its color; rotating an object or moving around it to discover hidden features or discern its three-dimensional shape; stepping back from an object to see how big it is; keeping your eye on an object to see whether or not it is moving; and (often unconsciously and automatically) accommodating the lens of your eye so that its focal power is appropriate to your distance from whatever you're trying to see. All these exploratory strategies, and others like them, are more than ways to "simply move around and sample the environment" -- they seem, as Fulkerson writes of tactual EPs, to be "specific actions that are used to experience particular . . . features (or clusters of features)", each one "closely tied to the feature that we wish to experience" (p. 57).[1]

A similar problem arises for a claim Fulkerson makes later on in the book, that bodily movement plays a role in the tactual perception of complex spatial features that it doesn't also play in sight. He writes:

it is a truism about touch that we are unable to experience many complex shape properties without active exploration. Simply consider any large object (anything bigger than the hand, say). To feel its shape requires coordinated exploratory motions over time. This is not really the case in vision, for in vision we seem to see the complete shape of an object more or less right away. To experience complex shape we must construct a representation of such features, step by step. The movements of our fingers, hands, arms, and whole body can make a difference in how this is accomplished. (p. 123)

But once again, this obscures the innumerable cases where the spatial features of a visible object or scene don't all come into view "right away" (or even "more or less" so), perhaps because they are just too large or complex to take in at once, or they have too many parts that are hidden from a given point of view, or an object is too nearby or far away, etc.[2] (Here an object illustrates several of these phenomena at once.) While it may be true that more of an object's spatial features can be taken in "right away" through vision than through touch, this is a matter of degree, not of kind, so it doesn't warrant Fulkerson's conclusion that touch and vision employ "very different ways" of extracting information about objects' spatial properties (p. 125).[3]

As a last example of this kind of difficulty, consider Fulkerson's discussion in chapter 4 of the role of bodily awareness in tactual perception. There, Fulkerson advances what he calls the thesis of informational bodily dependence (IBD), which holds that perceptual touch experience depends on bodily awareness insofar as bodily awareness is an essential "node in the informational network" at work in tactual perception (p. 95), such that we cannot be aware of objects through touch unless we are able also to be aware "from the inside" of our bodies. The defense of this thesis is mostly persuasive. But Fulkerson then argues that a similar thesis doesn't hold in the case of vision, writing that "visual experiences do not seem to depend on bodily awareness in the same way" as tactual ones (p. 108). This is questionable, however: to give a simple example, if in walking around an object to see its hidden surfaces I were not aware of my own bodily movements, then I would not be able to experience the object as stationary. And while perhaps this kind of exploratory movement isn't always necessary for some very rudimentary visual perception, the same seems true of purely cutaneous touch, or of the perception of ambient temperature, which seem possible even for someone who can't make her body an object of conscious awareness. Moreover, it's a simple fact about human beings that -- absent rigidly controlled conditions, at least -- as long as we are awake we almost always are moving, and being unable to keep track of these movements would make impossible for us to see the world as it is.

I should emphasize that my purpose in raising these objections is not to indicate any deep deficiency in Fulkerson's book. Though imprecise at times, what he has to say about touch, both in itself and in relation to other sensory modalities, is generally very persuasive, and well-supported by experimental and phenomenological evidence. It's a virtue of the book that it makes it possible to disagree as I have with some of its specific claims, thanks to the way it identifies so many crucial questions and helps to shift relevant phenomena into sharper relief. Anyone interested in the philosophy of perception should take the time to read it.[4]


Bramão, I., A. Reis, K.M. Petersson, and L. Faísca. 2011. The role of color information on object recognition: a review and meta-analysis. Acta Psychologica 138: 244-253.

Jones, L.A., and S.J. Lederman. 2006. Human Hand Function. New York: Oxford University Press.

Klatzky, R., J. Loomis, S. Lederman, H. Wake, and N. Fujita. 1993. Haptic identification of objects and their depictions. Perception & Psychophysics 54: 170-178

Lederman, S.J., and R.L. Klatzky. 1997. Relative availability of surface and object properties during early haptic processing. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance 23: 1680-1707.

Schwenkler, J. 2013. Do things look the way they feel? Analysis 73: 86-96.

Yarbus, A.L. 1967. Eye Movements and Vision. New York: Plenum.

[1] Something similar is revealed in Alfred Yarbus's well-known studies of the role of saccadic eye movements in the perception of a complex picture, which found that subjects move their eyes differently around a scene depending on what questions about it they have been instructed to answer (Yarbus 1967).

[2] I highlight the importance of active exploration in the visual perception of complex objects in my (2013).

[3] Nor does this conclusion follow from the finding that removing intensive cues like temperature and texture degrades haptic object recognition (pp. 124-125; discussing Klatzky et al., 1993), as the same phenomenon has been observed in visual perception, where object recognition can be degraded by the removal of color cues, especially for so-called "color diagnostic" objects (for a review and meta-analysis of numerous recent studies, see Bramão et al., 2011). If touch and vision are different in regard to the role played by intensive features, it is once again a matter of degree, not kind.

[4] Thanks to Robert Briscoe and Matt Fulkerson for comments on earlier drafts of this review, and to Gabriel de Marco for taking the time to read and discuss the book with me.