The Flame of Eternity: An Interpretation of Nietzsche's Thought

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Krzysztof Michalski, The Flame of Eternity: An Interpretation of Nietzsche's Thought, Benjamin Paloff (tr.), Princeton University Press, 2011, 231pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691143460.

Reviewed by Allison Merrick, University of Arkansas, Little Rock








There are, roughly, three ways in which scholars have attempted to interpret Nietzsche's philosophy. First, some have adopted a topical approach where Nietzsche's views on a particular issue are mined from his various works. The aim of this sort of approach is to collect Nietzsche's scattered reflections on a particular topic in the hopes of offering a cogent account of his views on the issue and of demonstrating the ways in which such insights may be relevant to contemporary philosophical debates.[1] Second, some have taken a systematic approach in which a central philosophical doctrine, such as the eternal recurrence, the will to power, or the affirmation of life, is seen as the central motivating or animating feature of Nietzsche's work.[2] Interpretations of this order attempt to show the centrality of a particular doctrine by claiming Nietzsche's complete oeuvre is best seen when viewed from this particular vantage point. The third eschews the former two options in favor of a close analysis of a particular text, by focusing on, for example, Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morals.[3] Krzysztof Michalski's book treads the second of these interpretive paths: "The subject of this book is eternity, the concept of eternity. The point of departure is Nietzsche. I contend that Nietzsche's thought can be organized into a consistent whole through precisely this concept of eternity" (vii).

Michalski's central thesis is indeed important as Nietzsche's use of the notion of eternity is certainly worth carefully unpacking and emphasizing. After all, Nietzsche suggests he is the "teacher of the eternal return."[4] He further informs us that the notion of the eternal return represents Thus Spoke Zarathustra's "most fundamental idea,"[5] and suggests it is "the highest formula of affirmation that can be attained."[6] But, as Michalski notes, the notion of eternity should not be limited to Nietzsche's views concerning the concept of eternal return: "In Nietzsche's books and notes, eternity emerges under the name 'the eternal return of the same.' But we find the notion of eternity not only when we hear of eternal return: it is present in nearly everything Nietzsche wrote, from his first sketches to his last pages before he succumbed to madness" (vii). For Michalski, the conception of eternity captures in its net the idea of temporality rather broadly construed such that it may be understood as "a dimension of time, the core of time, its essence, its engine . . . eternity comes to the fore precisely in the flow of time" (vii). Further, he contends, "eternity -- that link between passing and becoming, the link between past and future -- is 'mine'" (187). Accordingly, the notion lacks an overtly supra-historical dimension such that Michalski claims it is "intertwined with everything I do and think; it co-creates the meaning of life. Without it, my life would be incomprehensible" (187). Michalski sets himself the task of unpacking this fundamental idea, of showing how Nietzsche's use of the concept can be situated in relation to his other notions, such as the will to power, and of teasing out the nuance of Nietzsche's thought by holding the concept up against the backdrop of its use within religious thought. The book achieves these aims and is divided into nine essays each of which is written in a lucid and accessible style.

Essay 1 is a careful illustration of modernity's confrontation with nihilism. It documents the manner in which philosophical inquiry has been preoccupied with the "discover[y] of the eternal order of things," which is immune to contingency and change (1). The essay then situates Nietzsche's philosophical project as a "program of action," namely as "an attempt at overcoming nihilism, at reevaluating all values" (12).

Essay 2, entitled "Time Flows, the Child Plays," focuses on the second of the Untimely Meditations, and presents a learned discussion of the intrinsic temporal nature of the human condition, replete with disturbance, conflict, suffering, and satiety.

Essay 3, "Good and Evil, Joy and Pain," is a neat sketch of Nietzsche's genealogical analysis of morality, which contains a particularly interesting discussion of the manner in which we may be unknown to ourselves. However, it is not entirely clear how this discussion bears on the broader theme of "eternity." Nor is it clear how this detour fits into the overall structure of book, which moves, rather abruptly, from the "early" Nietzsche of the Untimely Meditations (essay 2), to the "late" Nietzsche of On the Genealogy of Morals (essay 3), before returning to the "middle" Nietzsche of Thus Spoke Zarathustra (essay 4).

Essays 4 and 5 return to the ways in which aversions to time and temporality may manifest themselves through the codification of our concepts. The former, entitled "Reason, Which Hurts," argues that, for Nietzsche, "universal rationality is an illusion" (54) and "an essential feature of life as we live it is chance: the new, unexpected, alien side of my life" (60). As such, chance serves to place a "question mark above everything that I am, and thus it concerns me, and this is no accident: it co-creates the meaning of my (fragile, endangered) identity. It hurts" (60). Hence, universal reason, on this account, is a means of eliminating danger and difference. Further such conceptualizations, Michalski contends, serve to hide the temporal dimensions of human life. Essay 5, argues that, for Nietzsche, modern science, insofar as it offers a univocal account of human existence, is a mode of deception insofar as it "irons out differences, removes potential conflicts, introduces continuity where we have seen none before, constancy amid flux" (69).

The sixth Essay, "The Death of God," deviates markedly from standard interpretations of Nietzsche's well-known declaration. Many commentators tend to approach the topic formulaically by first offering a close reading and reconstruction of "The Madman" passage, found in Book Three of The Gay Science, before turning to discuss potential responses to this event: the nihilistic collapse of meaning or the possibility of a re-evaluation, which may, according to Nietzsche, engender "relief, exhilaration, encouragement, dawn."[7] Instead, Michalski charts a new course and presents two visions of death -- one found in Plato's Phaedo and the other taken from the Gospel of Matthew. Michalski presents the salient points as follows:

The dying Socrates wanted to give us concepts that would provide peace, concepts that will soothe our anxiety in the face of death. The Gospel of Matthew, as I understand it, is the complete opposite: it testifies to the incurable presence of the Unknown in every moment of my life, a presence that rips apart every human certainty built on what is known, that disturbs all peace, all serenity -- that severs the continuity of time, opening every moment of lives to nothingness, thereby inscribing within them the possibility of an abrupt end and the chance at a new beginning. Two visions of death, two visions of the human condition (88-89).

This discussion, which seeks to problematize the notion of death, also brings to the fore another central feature of Michalski's interpretation. Nietzsche, he finds, is in "an unceasing debate with" the Old and New Testaments that may be viewed as "a wrestling with God" (202). Though Michalski may be commended for this novel approach to the topic of the death of God, it still seems far from clear why a brief account and subsequent analysis of "The Madman" passage is absent from this essay. Such a discussion no doubt bears upon the central theme of the book. Further, it would lend textual support to Michalski's contention that the notion of eternal life, in the hands of Nietzsche, "is not some other place, sometime, some other time, which awaits us as soon as this one, the one we know is over" (188). That is, for Nietzsche the death of God, as handled in both Book Three and Book Five of The Gay Science, should usher in the collapse of such narratives.

Each of the final three essays problematizes an aspect of the notion of eternity. Essay 7 "The Flame of Eternity," concerns Nietzsche's uses of metaphors, particularly the "world as a river" (93), the wind as a metaphor for becoming (102-107) and fire as a metaphor for "the radical discontinuity of human existence" (117). According to Michalski, each metaphor helps illustrate a dimension of eternity and of irremediable change not otherwise available to us. Essay 8, "Eternal Love," shows how a "discussion of the concept of eternal love may lead to insight into the nature of concepts themselves" (147) and argues in support of the thesis that eternity, properly understood, "is a physiological concept, that eternity is a dimension of our bodily presence in the world" (132). While Essay 9, "Our Insatiable Desire for More Future: On the Eternal Return of the Same," is a sustained treatment of Thus Spoke Zarathustra's "most fundamental idea."[8] I shall consider further this final essay.

There are at least three ways in which scholars have interpreted the eternal return. First, some have adopted a cosmological reading according to which the doctrine is seen as a theory concerning the nature of time. Second, some have suggested that it is best seen as an existential test of life-affirmation, while thirdly, others have adopted a symbolic reading which "takes [the eternal return] to be concerned with something other than the repetition of life."[9] In places Michalski seems to opt for the last, claiming, for instance: "The past . . . will not return . . . To think the abysmal thought is to grasp (let's say it again: with one's life not with knowledge) human reality not as a ready-made result, nor as something that is, but as the making of the unknown" (201). Nevertheless why we should adopt this reading rather than another is a genuine interpretive puzzle, which seemingly goes by the board.

As I stated at the start, Michalski adopts a systematic approach to Nietzsche's work according to which his views are organized around "the thought of the eternal return of the same" (178). This philosophical doctrine Michalski claims: "is Nietzsche's central thought, which organizes his conceptual universe" (178). Yet Michalski's argument, particularly essay 9, relies overwhelmingly on Nietzsche's Thus Spoke Zarathustra, and, as such, there is very little discussion of how the topic is treated in The Gay Science, particularly section 341, entitled "The Greatest Weight." This is odd given the objective of the book, which includes unpacking Nietzsche's work as a whole in reference to this concept, and unfortunate, given that Michalski has an innovate take on other concepts, such as the death of God, which have received a fair amount of treatment in the secondary literature.

Michalski's text certainly achieves its aims, and provides an impressive, albeit nuanced, account of Nietzsche's central thought. It is written in a style that is neither neutral nor disinterested. Rather, it is an engaging text sprinkled with autobiographical anecdotes that serve to neatly supplement the central arguments. The text may appeal to scholars interested in Nietzsche's vexed relationship with religious tradition and may be helpful to those working on the notion of eternity. It warrants both attention and a careful scholarly response.

[1] See, for example, Aaron Ridley, Nietzsche on Art New York: Routledge, 2007; Brian Leiter, Nietzsche on Morality, London: Routledge, 2002; Julian Young, Nietzsche's Philosophy of Art, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.

[2] See Lawrence Hatab, Nietzsche's Life Sentence: Coming to Terms with Eternal Recurrence, New York: Routledge, 2005; Karl Löwith, Nietzsche's Philosophy of the Eternal Recurrence of the Same, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1997; John Richardson, Nietzsche's System, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996; Bernard Reginster, The Affirmation of Life: Nietzsche on Overcoming Nihilism, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2006.

[3] See, for instance, Daniel Conway, Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morals: A Reader's Guide, London: Continuum, 2008; Lawrence J. Hatab, Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morals: An Introduction, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008; Christopher Janaway, Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche's Genealogy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007; Aaron Ridley,Nietzsche's Conscience: Six Character Studies from the Genealogy, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1998; David Owen, Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morality, Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press, 2007.

[4] Friedrich Nietzsche, Twilight of the Idols, trans. W. Kaufmann, New York: Penguin, 1990, p. 121.

[5] Friedrich Nietzsche, On the Genealogy of Morals and Ecce Homo, trans. W. Kaufmann, New York: Vintage Books, 1989, p. 294.

[6] Friedrich Nietzsche, On the Genealogy of Morals and Ecce Homo, trans. W. Kaufmann, New York: Vintage Books, 294.

[7] Friedrich Nietzsche, The Gay Science, trans. W. Kaufmann, New York: Vintage, 1974, p. 280.

[8] Friedrich Nietzsche, Ecce Homo, trans. Walter Kaufmann New York: Vintage Books,1967.

[9] Mathias Risse, "The Eternal Recurrence: A Freudian Look at What Nietzsche Took to

Be His Greatest Insight." In Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy, edited by Ken Gemes

and Simon May, 223-246. Oxford: Oxford University Press, p. 226.