The Fleeting Promise of Art: Adorno's Aesthetic Theory Revisited

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Peter Uwe Hohendahl, The Fleeting Promise of Art: Adorno's Aesthetic Theory Revisited, Cornell University Press, 2013, 184pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780801478987.

Reviewed by Owen Hulatt, University of York


This book comprises five chapters, which address various particular issues in Adorno's aesthetic theory. The book's 'defense of . . . but not an apology' (p. 19) for Adorno's aesthetics, and its contemporary relevance, is pursued not through delivering a systematic overview of it, but through a collection of essays on particular features of Adorno's work, many based on previously published papers. This works to the book's advantage, insofar as it does not attempt to systematize a body of work that -- as Peter Uwe Hohendahl points out -- often conducts itself through the strength and depth of its engagement with particular issues and opponents.

The substantial introduction skillfully situates the contemporary relevance of Adorno's aesthetic theory. Hohendahl locates Adorno's contemporary situation and relevance as best expressed in its astringent relationship to the 'new aesthetics' of Elaine Scarry and Peter de Bolla. This astringency comes through Adorno's thorough emphasis on the central role of particularity and formal articulation in both the artwork and the aesthetic, and their epistemic and political relevance. While Scarry is content to work together beauty and political significance, there is a forfeiture of the 'fundamental epistemological particularity' (p. 4) of the aesthetic experience. On the other hand, de Bolla explicitly moves closer to Adorno's emphasis on the particularity of aesthetic experience. However, in doing so he largely forfeits its epistemic particularity in favour of emphasis on its affective particularity. Accordingly, as Hohendahl shows, the emphasis on the objective articulation of the artwork, as the prime location of aesthetic value, is lost.

Hohendahl traces in the 'new aesthetics' (p. 7) of Scarry, de Bolla, Jonathan Loesberg, and analytic aesthetics more generally a double forfeiture. This is a forfeiture both of Adorno's commitment to the central role of the objective, particular articulation of both the artwork and the aesthetic experience, and a forfeiture of critical investigation of the artwork's claim to autonomy. This double forfeiture makes it impossible to place the idea of truth content, moreover socially critical truth content, as central to the aesthetic.

In chapter 1, Hohendahl pursues an account of Adorno's relationship to Kant's aesthetics. This cannot be said to be an issue in Adorno scholarship that has been under-explored, but Hohendahl traces with care the consistent oscillation between Kant and Hegel in Adorno's work. Adorno is continually drawn to Kant's formalism as a means not only of conceiving the structures of aesthetic judgement in its responsivity to the formal particularity of the artwork, but also as a means for making available a theory of natural beauty. Hegel, by contrast, in his emphasis on the aesthetic value of content, makes possible a developed view of the heteronomous engagements of the formal artwork with its external context. Without Hegel's developmental account of the mutual implication of aesthetic value and content, Adorno's historically extended narrative of the continual technological improvement and mutability of aesthetic value, internal to artistic construction, would not be possible. And yet a complete forfeiture of formalism would make all too plausible a complete subsumption of artistic and aesthetic autonomy to heteronomy, a closure of the ability to see aesthetic value in nature, and a subsumption of the 'sovereignty' of art to the lineaments of a historical narrative. As such, Adorno's account must continually travel between those of Kant and Hegel.

This idea, that Adorno's account chiastically travels between features of both Kant's and Hegel's work, is perhaps a familiar one. However, Adorno has often (not unreasonably) been seen as a thinker whose core concerns are reasonably static (the continuity between the inaugural lecture The Actuality of Philosophy and Negative Dialectics, written over 30 years later, has often been remarked). And, accordingly, Adorno's chiastic account of the relation between Kant and Hegel has often also been assumed to be something of a fixed matter. One of the very valuable contributions of this chapter is Hohendahl's demonstration that Adorno's thought on these figures was, in a very literal sense, in motion. This is developed with nuance, but as a broad example the comparatively strident Hegelianism of the early lectures makes way, as Hohendahl shows, for the more concessive account of Kant in Aesthetic Theory proper. We see Adorno revisit and reassess his relationship to Kant and Hegel, and by extension we see the chiastic position he occupies in motion across his works.

In the second chapter, Hohendahl turns to consideration of Adorno's theory of aesthetic truth. This chapter is highly mixed, threading together an exploration of Adorno's theory of truth of considerable complexity with an emphasis on 'theological figures', 'the absolute' and, latterly, gnosis. Hohendahl advances the claim, which is surely right, that the truth that Adorno sees as possessed by artworks is orthogonal to conceptual expression. Nonetheless, it demands philosophical examination, and hence it presents itself as an enigma, simultaneously inviting and rebuffing reason.

What is less clear is the transition that Hohendahl draws between the question of this enigmatic character -- partially a consequence of the artwork's participating in forms of 'spiritualization' (i.e., abstraction) in its construction -- and the 'quest for an absolute that can provide meaning to our lives' (p. 70). In the absence of a full explication of this move -- from enigma to theology and the absolute -- the question 'How serious is Adorno in his pursuit of a theological grounding of art[?]' (p. 71) seems quite abrupt. The question is by no means an obviously appropriate one.

Adorno's references to theology are, by and large, references to apophatic theology -- the idea of a purely negative access to that which eludes thought. This suggests that if we are to deploy Adorno's use of theological language as warrant to discuss an absolute for Adorno, it should be in purely negative terms. Hohendahl follows this intuition (e.g., p. 73) in rendering the absolute as a source of alterity constitutively incapable of capture by rational discourse. But as a consequence it is now not clear what talk of the 'absolute' captures which Adorno's own concept of the 'non-identical' cannot. Hohendhal does not fully define the nature of the absolute, nor its differentiation from non-identity, and so it is difficult to judge the extra contribution it makes to our understanding of Adorno's position.

Despite these issues, Hohendahl zeroes in on a highly significant feature of Adorno's account of the truth content of the artwork in this chapter, namely, that its truth is neither communicable in straightforward discourse nor irrational. This sets a task of some severity for any interpreter hoping to unriddle what, precisely, Adorno thinks this truth is, and what it means. In the final analysis, Hohendahl opts to identify the truth of the artwork with an 'intense aesthetic experience' (p. 73). Such a move correctly appeals to something like a say/show distinction, with the qualitatively unique constitution of aesthetic experience vouchsafing some form of experiential access to something that could not be subsumed by rational discourse without remainder.

What is missing, however, is an explanation of the articulation of this intense experience. The aesthetic experience is not unique merely through its intensity, but rather its propensity to deliver an articulated critique -- which discourse should mirror, in however mutilated a form. One might hope to ground this articulation in seeing the intense aesthetic experience as emergent from, or supervenient on, certain conceptual and socio-aesthetic problematics. However, as Hohendahl emphasizes far more the artwork's 'lack of conceptual rigor' (p. 72), Adorno's claim that 'Philosophy and art converge in their truth content'[1] becomes difficult to fully comprehend.

Chapter 3 turns to Adorno's emphasis on ugliness in the aesthetic. Hohendahl pursues this element of Adorno's work with great nuance, bringing out a well-wrought and fresh reexamination of the role of Adorno and Horkheimer's Dialectic of Enlightenment. Hohendahl brings out of the Dialectic an account that reverses the traditional relationship of the beautiful and the ugly. While the ugly is traditionally understood in aesthetics as deviation from the norms or practices that set the standards for beauty, Hohendahl convincingly argues that Adorno's account reverses this ordering. Rather, beauty emerges from the ugly. This novel argument is partially predicated on the identification of ugliness with primitive cultic and magical practices, and beauty with the ordering principles of instrumental rationality.

This identification clarifies Adorno's account, not least in relation to the mutable verdict on ugliness we often find in Adorno's work. This is ably brought out in a comparison of Adorno's critical work on Schoenberg and Stravinsky. This is of course one of the more notorious oppositions in Adorno's cultural canon. Stravinsky is roundly criticized for the regressive tendencies Adorno perceives in his valorization of primitivism in Le Sacre Printemps; whereas Schoenberg (prior to the twelve-tone method, at least) is valorized for the rigor and critical power of his work.

Reversion to the ugly is not merely a lagging behind in aesthetic technology, in Stravinsky, but implicated in a regression of consciousness that would have more than aesthetic consequences. In Adorno's view Stravinsky attempts to sink beneath the developed problematic intrinsic to aesthetic rationality, through attempting to import and revert to 'folk' forms of composition. These compositional structures do not grasp the socio-aesthetic problematic at its most complex, but regress to earlier, less advanced forms of consciousness. In this way, the appearance of the ugly in Stravinsky, as Hohendahl ably shows, is counter to that which the aesthetic demands. It is a regression towards the unalloyed irrationality of earlier stages of consciousness.

It is Schoenberg's work that displays the correct kind of ugliness for Adorno. In Schoenberg, ugliness appears not as a regression behind the tendencies of aesthetic rationality. Rather, Schoenberg engages and intensifies the problematic of aesthetic rationality, and forces it to display its own internal contradictions and the pre-rational residues in that rationality. Ugliness becomes critique, rather than regression, in the modern artwork.

Chapters 4 and 5 focus on Adorno's critical engagement with literature. Of particular note is Chapter 4's examination of Adorno's engagement with realism. Adorno's often polemical engagement with the realist theories of art of his time are perhaps responsible for the perception that representation is not a promising optic for understanding his work. Moreover, as Hohendahl himself shows, Adorno accentuates far more the propensity of the artwork to be a 'closed monad' without explicit representation of that which is external to it.

Despite these apparent obstacles, Hohendahl successfully brushes Adorno against the grain and reveals the quite central role of representation in Adorno's work. Representation is decoupled from realism, and shown to have a broader role in Adorno's aesthetics (p. 110). Looking at his engagement with Balzac, we are shown how Adorno, despite himself, is forced to concentrate on concrete content, rather than pure formal organization, in the novel, and to accordingly see representation as a central element of the successful artwork (pp. 109-110).

Of course, this representation diverges from the kind of directness that the late Georg Lukács urged -- and Adorno disparaged. Hohendahl focuses on Adorno's theory of 'true realism' and, by implication, true representation. Kafka is emblematic of the kind of inversions that true representation comes to consist in, for Adorno, in which meaning and representation are decoupled. The impossibility of meaning comes to determine the contours appropriate for representation, inverting the relation found in Balzac or even Proust, on Adorno's analysis. This inversion, which finds expression in the broken-off, rubble-like fragments into which Kafka's montage-like account resolves, opens the need for theoretical mediation to make the link between the meaning and representation clear. Here the break between representation and realism becomes clear; representation is now a free-floating phenomenon, which evinces no direct link to the real external to it. Rather, interpretation is now required to navigate the gap between this free-floating representation, and the real which occasions it. As such, an articulated theory of the real now becomes an ineluctable part of the interpretation of the artwork.

As Hohendahl shows, this opens the very clear threat that interpretation of this sort will be allowed to tendentiously force the artwork into serving as evidence for its interpreter's governing theory. The theoretical armature of Adorno's theory of society -- as being a 'totality' that completely mediates and diminishes the individual -- is employed in navigating the gap between Kafka's form of representation and the meaning we struggle to find in it. And we see that Adorno takes Kafka to serve as evidence of the correctness of this theoretical armature. The suspicion for which Hohnendahl quite carefully prepares the ground is that Adorno forcibly wedges this theory into the hermeneutic gap, rather than finding an appropriately articulated space in which it belongs. While representation becomes decoupled from immediately available meaning, it becomes clear that Adorno capitalizes on this to yield a model of representation in which modern artworks (rather conveniently) represent Adorno's own theory.

Hohendahl is concessive on this score (p. 114), seeing this hermeneutic gap as an unavoidable feature of representation in modern artworks. Indeed, we can also see that Hohendahl has also hit upon an elegant way of approaching Adorno's claim that the artwork, despite being a 'closed monad' with no intentional imitative relation to the external world, can be held to depict and critique it. The decoupling of representation and meaning allow for representation in such a monad (p. 122). However, the concerns Hohendahl raises about the justificatory problems this stratagem involves remain perhaps more troubling than he implies.

The Fleeting Promise of Art displays admirable sensitivity to the particularity of Adorno's interventions in various aesthetic debates, and at points moves to show the degree to which Adorno's interventions do not of necessity seamlessly cohere with each other. (Particular emphasis is laid on the difficult relationship between Adorno's official aesthetic theory and the lineaments of his critical engagements with concrete works of literature, which are explored in the last two chapters). Each of its five chapters intervenes in the study of Adorno's work in an original way, and the book at points offers a new optic through which to approach some of the problematic features of Adorno's work.

[1] Theodor Adorno, Aesthetic Theory, trans Robert Hullot-Kentor, (London: Continuum, 2004), p. 172.