The Flesh of Images: Merleau-Ponty between Painting and Cinema

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Mauro Carbone, The Flesh of Images: Merleau-Ponty between Painting and Cinema, Marta Nijhuis (tr.), SUNY Press, 2015, 119pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438458793.

Reviewed by Jessica Wiskus, Duquesne University


The Flesh of Images provides the English reader with a translation of Mauro Carbone's important book published in 2011. Its six chapters -- a series of separate essays -- propose a richly-textured analysis of Merleau-Ponty's notion of flesh. Carbone's main contribution consists in placing this notion into dialogue with the work of other philosophers and artists, a method that he employs to brilliant effect. For example, a chapter like "It Takes a Long Time to Become Wild: Gauguin According to Merleau-Ponty, Merleau-Ponty According to Gauguin" (on painting, in Merleau-Ponty's words, "without the skin of things, but giving their flesh") situates Carbone as one of the most creative interpreters of Merleau-Ponty today.

The focus here is on Merleau-Ponty's later works, with The Visible and the Invisible, Eye and Mind, and the Notes de cours 1959-1961 positioned as texts of central concern. Carbone's aim is to illuminate and develop the traces of a "new ontological perspective" that he understands as motivating this later work (1). In the book's introduction, Carbone argues that Merleau-Ponty's notion of flesh should be understood as a kind of "visibility" -- as a "'new type of being'" that concerns the reciprocal relation between vision and the visible (1). Throughout, Carbone reads works of art (particularly paintings and films) through this theme of visibility and, together with Merleau-Ponty, shows how they disclose a certain "'mutation within the relations of man and Being'" (58). What we must understand through these works, Carbone argues, is that the artist looks ever beyond what is visible, bringing to expression something that was never present -- yet something that was always already contained or caught up in the horizon of being. This means that, first of all, artists do not merely form images as imitations; rather, artists render visible (in a formula drawn from Paul Klee). But secondly, this rendering by the artist does not take place only as an activity performed in relation to the apparent passivity of the visible; in some curious way (and in a way that Carbone figures against Neoplatonism), the visible sees the artist. It sees the artist, Carbone writes, according to a "desire of the visible Being to see itself, which would thus make it envelop those particular visible beings that are also seers" (2).

As Carbone describes it, then, visibility is accomplished at the fold between the rendering of the visible and the desire of the visible. There is a kind of dynamic, reciprocal expression at work through visibility. Thus it is fitting that, over the course of his six essays, Carbone turns from the image in painting to the moving images of film -- that is to say, from visibility understood through space to visibility understood through time. According to Carbone, the visibility disclosed through film demonstrates a temporal reciprocity characterized as the mutual anticipation or precession of "vision and the visible" (5), as if, in a sense, the desire of the visible Being were always summoning, in advance, its creative realization (to be achieved retrospectively through vision).

It is the way that Carbone explores this temporal reciprocity that will be of interest to his closest readers, for what he accomplishes with respect to this theme takes place not only thanks to the arguments of his individual essays. What is remarkable about The Flesh of Images is that Carbone seems to position his own oeuvre as operating according to the same kind of "reciprocal precession" that he highlights in the late philosophy of Merleau-Ponty (5).

To gather the sense of the dynamic movement at work in Carbone's oeuvre, it is best to read this book in the company of other books. The elegant style of Carbone's prose -- crafted with a certain cadence and phrasing, an inimitable world of language -- nevertheless does not conceal the complexity of his scholarly research. Carbone engages with an astonishing range of interlocutors. In the first chapter alone (itself a mere thirteen pages of text), he analyzes Merleau-Ponty's notion of flesh in relation to work by Edmund Husserl, Sigmund Freud, Gaston Bachelard, Jean-Paul Sartre, Jean-François Lyotard, Jacques Derrida, Michel Henry, Jean-Luc Nancy, Didier Franck, et alia. This amounts to a virtuosic performance: Carbone selects precisely the motif from each author that might most productively play against the others. In this way, Carbone generates a contrapuntal work of dense layers -- layers that are difficult to plumb without the committed effort of the reader. As evidenced by the fact that the book's six chapters amount, without notes, to a total of less than 80 pages of text, Carbone does not devote much effort to the contextualization of his references. This may leave some readers with an impoverished sense of his argument -- especially readers who may be new to Carbone's own work; for of the many interlocutors with whom Carbone productively engages, the one who clearly exhibits the most influence is none other than Carbone himself.

Readers who are already familiar with Carbone's books available in English, The Thinking of the Sensible (Northwestern, 2004) and An Unprecedented Deformation (SUNY, 2010), will find themselves in familiar territory. And those who follow and admire Carbone's work in its various other outlets may be disappointed to discover that this book consists in a repackaging of essays that each had been published before 2015. But their disappointment would be misplaced. With its frequent re-writes and whole-scale repetitions of earlier works, we might think of The Flesh of Images as a compelling "greatest-hits" volume that includes both classic studio takes and a few reinterpretations or live performances of old favorites. (The musical comparison is not without merit -- what other art form makes use so productively of repetition and variation to generate qualitatively new experiences?) Indeed, there is not a single chapter in the book that does not bring to the overall collection its own peculiar publication history -- a history that, often enough, can in no way be characterized as linear.

For example, in the first chapter ("Flesh: Toward the History of a Misunderstanding"), the section called "Merleau-Ponty, Freudianism, and Flesh" will be familiar to readers of An Unprecedented Deformation as a section of the fourth chapter entitled "Freudianism as a Philosophy of the Flesh." But, curiously, Carbone's brief inquiry into fetishism and the poetic power of the flesh here is much more fully developed in An Unprecedented Deformation. How might we explain that this book (published in 2010) seems to expand the work of The Flesh of Images (published in French in 2011)? Actually, the entire first chapter of The Flesh of Images is but a reprinting (with an appended conclusion) of a much earlier essay published under the same title ("Flesh: Toward the History of a Misunderstanding") in Chiasmi International in 2002; it is this article that serves as a source. But since the chapter in An Unprecedented Deformation engages with the material from the 2002 Chiasmi article in a fresh way, the reprinting of the article now effects a curious movement according to which Carbone seems to ask that we understand anew what was originating (i.e. the 2002 article). There is something interesting in this.

As another example, the third chapter ("'Making Visible': Merleau-Ponty and Paul Klee") is essentially a close re-writing of the fourth chapter from Carbone's 2004 book. The difference between the two versions is that The Flesh of Images also stitches this material together with a section on voyance taken from chapter three ("Nature: Variations on the Theme") of The Thinking of the Sensible. Thus, "'Making Visible'" has two sources. Moreover, the first source was itself a reprint of an essay of the same name first published in a collection titled Chiasms: Merleau-Ponty's Notion of Flesh (SUNY, 2000). The second source was also reprinted in An Unprecedented Deformation (i.e. as the first chapter, "Nature: Variations on the Theme"). Recalling that The Flesh of Images is itself a translation of La chair des images from 2011 and noting that the third chapter from this French collection was also reprinted in 2012 in an edited collection called Du sensible à l'oeuvre: Esthétiques de Merleau-Ponty, we might wonder at the complex tangle of references, rehearsals, repetitions, and re-writes at play in the presentation of this chapter.

Although Carbone himself does not disclose these connections, I believe that it is precisely by way of these relations that we may understand how the composition of this book performs the very ideas central to Carbone's philosophy. Between the reprints and the rewrites -- through the process of an oeuvre unfolding across time -- we experience the way that Carbone's thought is realized according to a movement of institution or "reciprocal precession" (5). In effect, Carbone's philosophical oeuvre -- if we understand it in terms of the notion of visibility that he has suggested -- operates according to a principle of montage, for it is his assembling (and reassembling) of individual works that lends them new expressivity.

This principle of montage Carbone explores in the fourth chapter ("The Philosopher and the Moviemaker: Merleau-Ponty and Cinematic Thinking") -- the lengthiest and, without a doubt, most important chapter in the book -- where he turns from painting to cinema and even challenges the notion of image in itself. Carbone writes,

On this subject, Merleau-Ponty specifies that "a film is not a sum of total images, but a temporal Gestalt." Within this temporal Gestalt, which is essentially characterized by its rhythm, "the meaning of a shot therefore depends on what precedes it in the movie, and this succession of scenes creates a new reality which is not merely the sum of its parts" (42).

It is this rhythm -- this rhythm through which past, present and future images are bound as "'a new reality'" -- that Carbone analyzes on the ontological level "not as movement in Being, but rather as movement of Being itself" (54): as a rhythm of Being.

And, significantly, that rhythm brings us to the conclusion of the book -- a book ostensibly devoted to images -- where Carbone shifts from an ontology understood through the practice of vision to one understood through the practice of listening. We are reminded that when Merleau-Ponty, in a working note from The Visible and the Invisible, writes of "paintings without identifiable things, without the skin of things, but giving their flesh" (a signal quotation for Carbone), he is describing not images but music. And so on the final pages, Carbone concludes:

Being, traditionally considered as what endures beyond the deceptive visibility of becoming but that is nevertheless accessible by another mode of vision -- precisely, the being of an idea -- here shows its ineffaceable sensible rootedness, and shows it first thanks to that art that is canonically related to time and thus to becoming, an art that offers itself as a mode of encounter -- listening -- that as such shields it from the paradigm of the face to face and from representation, an art that therefore allows us to think our being, as well as the being of the idea, in nonsubstantive, even nonidentifying terms: music, of course (82).

Here, Carbone is gesturing implicitly toward Proust and the petite phrase (which featured in An Unprecedented Deformation). Yet, in light of this conclusion, should we not ask if Carbone's oeuvre -- an oeuvre that so actively engages in repetitions and variations of its own works -- demonstrates its rhythmic formation in a decidedly musical way? If so, this musical form would offer a kind of symphony performed not in minutes but in decades -- that is to say, on a time-scale not unlike that of the musical structure of Proust's À la recherche du temps perdu. And perhaps, after all, it is this Proustian form that is most fitting for Carbone's own richly-textured and dynamic philosophical imagination.