The Form of Practical Knowledge: A Study of the Categorical Imperative

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Stephen Engstrom, The Form of Practical Knowledge: A Study of the Categorical Imperative, Harvard University Press, 2009, 260 pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674032873.

Reviewed by Patrick Kain, Purdue University


In the preface to the Groundwork, Kant describes the "doctrine of morals" as a type of practical rational cognition, but, according to Stephen Engstrom, most readers have failed to appreciate the significance of this claim. Engstrom argues that if one understands Kant's contention that morality is practical knowledge of intrinsic goodness (pp. 10, 241) or of unconditionally good action, then many of Kant's oft-misunderstood and maligned claims about morality, and about the Universal Law Formulation of the Categorical Imperative in particular, can be clarified and vindicated. Engstrom's general thesis may not be quite as novel as he may think: prominent interpreters such as Henrich, Paton, Beck, and Donagan have stressed, in various ways, the centrality of Kant's conceptions of reason and of knowledge to his practical philosophy and to his conception of the moral law in particular (and they have also noted ways in which Kant's conception can be seen as a distinctive contribution to a cognitivist tradition in ethics that reaches back to Plato and Aristotle). Nonetheless, Engstrom effectively focuses readers' attention on a very important thesis, offers a particular and interesting account of what practical knowledge is, and argues that this account can do some very important work within Kantian ethics. Those interested in Kant and in Kantian approaches in ethics, epistemology, and action theory should pay careful attention to this volume.

The book can be divided into two parts: an "extended" "preliminary examination" of Kant's conception of the will and his conception of cognition and judgment (chapters II-V) is followed by a "direct interpretation" of Kant's account of the categorical imperative which aims to rebut a number of classic objections to Kant's ethics (chapters VI-VII). (p. xi) By Engstrom's own admission, the preliminary examination, while lengthy, is austere and abstract. It is also presented mostly sui generis. Pages will often go by without any citations to Kant's texts or analytic or historical scholarship, and when this literature is selectively engaged, the engagement is often very brief (though often insightful nonetheless). Engstrom's primary emphasis is on his own reconstruction of the concepts and arguments rather than Kant's texts, interpretive disputes, or rival approaches. The second, "interpretive" portion of the book does interact more with Kant's texts, especially the Groundwork, and with a few rival interpretations of it. After outlining four of Engstrom's central contentions, I will offer some critical reactions.

First, in chapter II, Engstrom proposes an interpretation of Kant's conception of the will, which is built upon a robust conception of practical thought. Practical thinking, or "intention," is conceived of as a form of efficacious mental representation, the efficacy of which must be, in principle, self-conscious or transparent to itself. "Practical thinking can make its object actual through and only through its consciousness that it can do so."[1] (p. 30) Engstrom argues that this account of practical thinking has two significant entailments. First, it implies that all practical thought must be subject to certain rational requirements: an agent is not to intend an end she considers impossible, and she must intend means sufficient to her end.[2] (pp. 40-41) Second, Engstrom argues that practical thinking is essentially an agent's activity of self-constitution.

To intend to do something is to specify, in an act of practical thought, what one means to do, and this is just to specify one's conception of what one, as a practical subject, means to do, which in turn is to specify one's conception of oneself as an agent, or what we may call one's practical self-conception. And since this self-conception is efficacious, it constitutes the agent, the practical subject, itself. (p. 33, cf. 120)

Second, in chapters IV and V, Engstrom articulates and deploys a rather strict conception of knowledge (and cognition, which he employs synonymously) and of judgment. Cognitions must be "self-consciously self-sustaining," and stand "in relations of necessary agreement, relations of mutual support and confirmation," where the source of such necessary agreement must be "within … the cognitive faculty itself." (pp. 104-105, 107) Every "logical" judgment

consists in the essentially self-conscious exercise of the capacity to know and so includes … the necessary self-understanding … that all judgments, so far as they are proper exercisings of the capacity to know, are cognitions and hence in necessary agreement. (p. 111)

A key to such necessary agreement is "double universality": any proper exercise of the capacity to know must possess both "subjective universal validity" (or validity "for all [judging] subjects" (p. 115)) and "objective universal validity" (or validity "for all objects falling under [the judgment's subject] concept" (p. 116)). In the theoretical domain, for example, this account implies that cognitions from concepts must be "grounded in knowledge concerning objects' law-governed coexistence," (p. 114) and cognitions must possess systematic "coherence … standing together in relations of mutual support in one body of knowledge," (p. 113) since "knowledge is essentially a whole, or system, of representations." (p. 105) These conditions of "necessary agreement" in judgment, especially the requirement of "double universality", express the "form of theoretical knowledge" and indicate constitutive norms of judging in the theoretical domain.

Engstrom's conception of practical cognition emerges from the conjunction of his conception of cognitive judgment with the aforementioned conception of practical thought. As practical or efficacious thought, "practical knowledge is always knowledge cognizing subjects have of what they themselves are to do." (p. 121) "As rational" or as cognition, "practical knowledge has a double universal validity; in this regard it is no different from its theoretical sibling." (p. 123) Engstrom proceeds to distinguish two primary types of practical judgment, which are both exercises of the capacity for practical knowledge: wish (or potentially efficacious judgment determining what is "practical" or "simply good") and choice (or efficacious judgment determining what is "practicable" or "good on the whole to do").[3] (pp. 46, 68) As an exercise of the capacity for practical knowledge, each particular practical judgment (and thus each wish and choice), "contains in its self-consciousness an understanding of itself as in accordance with the form of [practical knowledge]." Engstrom argues that this understanding, built into the concept of practical knowledge, is the basis for the categorical imperative.

Third, in chapter III, Engstrom constructs an intricate explanation of Kant's oft-puzzling "claim that happiness is an end for every human being, an end that belongs to the very being or essence (Wesen) of a finite rational being" (p. 84) In a finite rational being, pleasant sensations give rise to "judgments of the agreeable," (p. 70) judgments which in turn provide "the material condition of the simply good," (p. 71) a condition or criterion on which practical judgment must rely. (p. 69) These judgments arise, Engstrom explains, because of "a primitive act of practical judgment" in which "what one finds agreeable in general is made into an object of one's will … through being brought under [the] concept of the simply good." (p. 70, cf. 82) This primitive practical judgment is necessary and

is implicated in the very concept of a person, or a subject with the capacity for practical knowledge. It is implicated as the act in which an individual person first constitutes itself as such, being as much a judgment that makes a person as a judgment a person makes. (pp. 81-82)

Engstrom argues that this primitive "wish for happiness" must have a "two-fold character": it is both a wish for happiness, generically or formally conceived, and it must include a wish for "practical self-sufficiency," i.e., for the powers and means adequate to secure the object of one's wish. (pp. 88-89) This wish plays an important role in Engstrom's interpretation of the application of the categorical imperative.

Fourth, in chapters VI and VII, Engstrom deploys his account of practical knowledge to support an interpretation of the categorical imperative that may rebut many classic objections to Kant's ethics. Engstrom argues that the Groundwork's "formula of universal law" expresses the form of practical knowledge; this may address questions about its "derivation."[4] On Engstrom's interpretation, what the formula of universal law requires is that each maxim (or, at least, some abstract and basic maxims) can be willed as a universal law. Since what is at issue, according to Engstrom, is a law for all beings with "the capacity for practical knowledge," a maxim must be considered, within "the test," as a "law that all rational beings necessarily follow out of their shared recognition of its validity, its rational necessity" (pp. 161-162). If such consideration reveals that a maxim contains contradictory practical judgments (especially contradictory judgments about what is "simply good"), then the maxim in question lacks "objective universal validity;" it must be intrinsically bad and is prohibited. Drawing on his claim (above) that the necessary "wish for happiness" includes a wish for both happiness, generically conceived, and for practical self-sufficiency, Engstrom argues, contra a familiar criticism, that the "formula of universal law" can generate positive duties to others, including both duties of natural justice and duties of beneficence. Given these two necessary wishes, he explains, the only way to avoid making contradictory judgments about what is "simply good" is to limit one's freedom by justice and to extend one's practical judgments to include the happiness of others as "simply good." Engstrom contends that this interpretation adjudicates Kant's canonical examples well, fits the text, and preserves the concept of intrinsic goodness and badness better than other interpretations, such as Korsgaard's "practical contradiction" interpretation, which, he claims, relies on prudential considerations and on "contingencies lying outside the will." (pp. 225-6, cf. 166)

I hope this sketch allows the reader to appreciate the complexity and the significance of Engstrom's reconstruction of Kant's ethics. In what follows, I will suggest some critical reactions to Engstrom's proposal and its prospects for success.

A first set of critical reflections concerns some of the details of Engstrom's account of intention, self-constitution, and the wish for happiness. Engstrom's arguments for the centrality of self-constitution are quite difficult, and their precise significance is somewhat uncertain. Engstrom seems, at points, to reduce all action and intention to radical self-constitution itself, to some necessarily and transparently efficacious, virtually unconstrained thinking about what to do or how to be. It seems to be part of Engstrom's concept of practical thought, for example, that it is self-consciously efficacious self-constitution, and that one is (at least implicitly) aware, in a sense of "awareness" that includes veridicality, that one has and is exercising such a power. (This suggests the bold thesis that we can be immediately aware that epiphenomenalism is false, for example.) The suggestion that our practical thought is virtually unconstrained self-constitution is somewhat misleading, however. Engstrom also contends that there are several essential or formal elements within the practical self-consciousness of all finite rational beings, elements that necessarily condition their self-conscious self-constitution. For example, Engstrom insists that, for finite rational beings, consciousness of one's finitude and receptivity is essential to one's practical self-conception and must condition even the most primitive act of self-constitution. The "primitive wish for happiness … cannot take place in a vacuum, but is possible only in a certain material condition of receptivity." The

act of judgment that first constitutes a person presupposes … specifically a self-conception that includes awareness of this sensible condition, distinguishing this particular practical subject from every other … an indeterminate, or yet to be determined, conception of oneself as a particular practical subject capable of determining oneself in a practical judgment, and this presupposed conception accordingly belongs to the form of every maxim. (p. 238)

It is not clear to me precisely how or why our practical self-conception (and by extension, each intention or practical thought) must always include awareness of this passive or receptive moment. Engstrom is clear that this piece of practical awareness is not itself an act.[5] Is it a matter of psychological necessity? Is it, rather, a normative requirement for practical responsiveness to our (theoretical) awareness of how we are, in some sense, already at least partially constituted by nature?[6] Indeed, on Engstrom's account, some of the "formal" features of our practical self-conception seem to be a response to experience (or, at least, to our experience of practical thought), not an a priori element of practical thought itself. (p. 80) There are difficult questions about the content and coherence of Kant's own views on these matters. Engstrom offers one of the most developed recent attempts to make sense of them, and he need not settle all of these questions here. Yet some of the details of Engstrom's reconstruction and the precise force of his strong "self-constitution" language are elusive, and some of these details may affect the relationship between theoretical and practical knowledge and the relationship between virtue and happiness, which are important to his project.

A second set of critical reflections concerns Engstrom's account of judgment, knowledge, and cognition. In his compact twenty page sketch of a Kantian theory of cognition, Engstrom had to abstract from many difficult textual and systematic questions about Kant's epistemology, shifting quickly between discussions of judgment and reason, and cognition and knowledge, and avoiding explicit treatment of Kant's claims about the variety of "degrees of cognition," "analogies of experience," "antinomies of pure reason," "regulative ideas," and so on. (Though Engstrom does allude to a few of these items, cf. pp. 15, 105, 117.) The upshot of this sketch is the contention that it is a conceptual truth that all cognitions must stand in "necessary agreement" in a very robust, positive sense; but one might register a few reservations here.

First, it is not clear that Kant thought all "logical" judgments are subject to such strong conditions. ("Judgments of perception," in contrast to "judgments of experience," for example, might be one such exception.) Second, fully satisfying Engstrom's positive requirements for cognition may approximate what Kant would call rational "insight" or "comprehension" (a degree of cognition that Kant thought was possible only in certain limited domains). We should also not forget Kant's contentions that the cognitive powers of reason, understanding, and judgment need to be distinguished, and that reason's pursuit of the "unconditioned" may not only enable knowledge, but can also trigger skepticism. So, Engstrom's conception of cognition may be stricter and more controversial than Kant's own (which is controversial in its own right). These points are germane to Engstrom's project because his reconstruction of Kant's moral philosophy rests upon his bold claims about reason and cognition: that practical knowledge has universal scope (that our every practical thought or practical judgment is subject to its norms), it embodies strict standards (including "positive agreement" and "double universality"), and that practical reason does not threaten our knowledge or trigger skepticism. Additional argument may be needed before we could conclude that practical knowledge, so strictly understood, is necessary or even really possible for us (more on the latter below).

A third cluster of critical reactions concerns Engstrom's interpretation of the formula of universal law, which deserves more careful consideration than I can provide here. Many of the details of Engstrom's account are illuminating, such as the brief discussion of "implicit," if "obscure," forms of practical knowledge present in immoral action. Yet, it is not clear to me that Engstrom's approach has the key advantage he claims over the rival "practical contradiction" interpretation. While Engstrom is correct that the practical contradiction interpretation emphasizes questions of "practicability", whereas his own interpretation foregrounds matters of "practicality," this contrast may not be decisive. First, Engstrom's own approach does appeal to some considerations of practicability: in the case of justice, external freedom and self-sufficiency are themselves concerned with all-purpose means rather than ends, and in the case of beneficence, Engstrom's appeal to the immediacy and necessity of "help from practical recognition" is similarly instrumental (212). Second, it seems that both interpretations of "the test" rely upon "material" conditions or things "outside of" the form of pure will to generate their contradictions. Each does or can make use of the universal wish for happiness (and its presuppositions of need and limited power), the norms of mere practical thought, and Engstrom's idea of a shared "practical world," (192) for example. On each account, these elements and considerations are supposed to be reflected within the agent's own practical reflection. These elements are either "formal" elements of practical cognition (even if they are not part of the form of pure will itself) or they are not; either way, each of the rival versions of the test may appeal to them with legitimacy. Engstrom's account of why they are legitimate may be better than alternatives, or perhaps there are other problems with the practical contradiction interpretation which require additional appeals to external contingencies in order to generate acceptable results, but that would be a different point.

A fourth and final set of reflections concerns Kant's doctrines of "the unity of reason" and of the "highest good," a systematic union of virtue and happiness. Although Engstrom mentions these doctrines in a few asides and occasional footnotes, he gives them no sustained attention in this book. But it seems to me, in light of the foregoing reflections, that Engstrom's conception of practical knowledge and self-constitution is difficult to disentangle from such doctrines. If, as Engstrom maintains, it is essential to the concept of knowledge that all judgments are capable of "necessary agreement" and "mutual support" based in the cognitive faculty itself, then this may entail significant claims about the content of practical knowledge and about the relationship between practical knowledge and theoretical knowledge. And if, as Engstrom suggests, the form of self-constitution of finite rational beings implies that any wish be compatible with its pursuit "as a member in a system of elements belonging to a common end" (p. 78) and that happiness is a necessary end for finite agents like us, then the proper object of our practical knowledge must be the "complete good," the union of morality and happiness, not just morality. Now, if all practical knowledge must be mutually supporting and in necessary agreement, then practical knowledge of the intrinsic good ("morality") is possible only if it can stand in harmony and necessary agreement with practical knowledge of the complete good. ("Double universality" in judgments about intrinsic goodness may be necessary, but this does not seem sufficient for genuine practical knowledge, on this account.) Any practical knowledge entails that morality must harmonize with happiness. Conversely, if the complete good seems unattainable by our actions (because of our primitive practical awareness of our finitude and limited power), then "practical knowledge" of the complete good is not possible for us, which seems to entail that practical knowledge per se is not possible (since "knowledge is essentially a whole"), and thus that morality, understood as practical knowledge of the intrinsic good, cannot be possible either. Even if our "original position" is oriented toward "practical knowledge" (p. 245), our practical thinking seems to be led to skepticism about practical knowledge and about the possibility of rational self-constitution.

In short, Engstrom's account may need a "postulate" of the real possibility of the highest good, and perhaps for a postulate of God to support it, and this need may be at least as strong as Kant's own need for such postulates. (It may be a virtue of Engstrom's interpretive proposals that it also seems to point in such a direction, even if this is a direction he does not pursue here.) Perhaps Engstrom would accept some or all of Kant's "postulates." Or perhaps Engstrom can develop grounds for resisting such postulates: perhaps a further refined conception of cognition and/or a further refined account of primitive self-constitution may clarify how this form of Kantian morality may be sustained without such postulates. In any event, the ultimate vindication of Engstrom's distinctive contentions about practical cognition, and the contributions they make to our understanding of the meaning, content, and application of the categorical imperative, may await a more thorough treatment of such questions than could be provided in this book. This book opens up much fertile ground for future work, by Engstrom and others, on many important issues.

[1] "Practical thought" is intended as a reconstruction of Kant's conception of "desire in accord with concepts" or the generic form of Willk├╝r.

[2] Notably, Engstrom contends that this conception of practical thought or intention does not, by itself, require morality. (pp. 91-94, 243) Thus, it may be that a prudent amoralist could fulfill all of the rational requirements of "mere practical thought;" practical knowledge requires more.

[3] This is supposed to capture Kant's distinction between "wish" and "will," as two exercises of a freie Willk├╝r, or of a will that is "practical reason."

[4] While this first formula emphasizes "objective universal validity," Engstrom argues that since practical thought is a self-relation and its object just is its subject, the two forms of universal validity necessarily coincide. Since Kant's "formula of humanity" and "formula of autonomy", in their own way, also express this same presupposition of universality, so understood, Kant's three formulas are equivalent.

[5] Since this essential element of practical thought is not itself an act, one might also wonder why the primitive wish for happiness must be conceived of as an act, as Engstrom maintains.

[6] Similar questions might be raised about Engstrom's claims that it is essential to "choice" that one is practically conscious of the limits of one's power of agency. (pp. 67, 80)