The Foundations of Arithmetic

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Gottlob Frege, The Foundations of Arithmetic, Dale Jacquette (tr.), Longman, 2007, 144pp., $9.60 (pbk), ISBN 9780321241894.

Reviewed by Michael Kremer, University of Chicago


Last spring, as I was beginning a graduate seminar on Frege, I received a complimentary copy of this new translation of his masterwork, The Foundations of Arithmetic. I had ordered Austin's famous translation, well-loved for the beauty of its English and the clarity with which it presents Frege's overall argument, but known to be less than literal, and to sometimes supplement translation with interpretation. I was intrigued by Dale Jacquette's promise "to combine literal accuracy and readability for beginning students and professional scholars alike," and to improve on Austin where the latter "does not always faithfully represent or seem to perfectly understand certain of Frege's German idioms." (v) Such a translation, complete with index, critical introduction, and commentary, and at a bargain price, seemed worthy of my students' attention. So, I mentioned to the class that this book might be worth looking into.

Unfortunately, within a day or two I felt compelled to warn my students against this version of Foundations. On examination, I had found the translation to be unreliable and the critical introduction and commentary filled with misunderstanding.

My first move on opening the book was to turn to one of the most important passages in Foundations, which Austin mistranslates (if only slightly). At the crucial moment of transition from the critical first part of Foundations to the constructive second part, Frege proposes as a key to his investigation of the concept of number to analyze the primary context of application of number, what he calls a "statement of number" ("Zahlangabe"). He notes that while considering a single state of affairs, one can say equally "Here are four companies" or "Here are 500 men." He argues that what changes here is not the reality described but the terminology used to describe it, and that this change of terminology corresponds to a change in the concept applied to that reality. He concludes "Damit wird uns als Antwort auf die erste Frage des vorigen Paragraphen nahe gelegt, dass die Zahlangabe eine Aussage von einem Begriffe enthalte." (GL, 59) Austin translates: "This suggests as the answer to the first of the questions left open in our last paragraph, that the content of a statement of number is an assertion about a concept." Frege later referred to this answer as the "most fundamental of my results" in Foundations. (FR, 197) However, Austin's translation is inaccurate: Frege does not speak of "the content of a statement of number," and his key insight is better rendered "a statement of number contains an assertion about a concept" -- a correction adopted by Michael Beaney in his Frege Reader. (FR, 99)

This is a crucial passage in the Foundations, where it is relatively simple to improve on Austin's translation. Hence, I used it as a first test case of Jacquette's work. In this, I was disappointed, albeit in a surprising way: the key passage simply isn't there! Jacquette's rendering of the above sentence is just this: "Therewith an answer to the first question of the previous paragraph is recommended to us." (56) Thus the most fundamental result of the book does not even appear in its proper place in Jacquette's translation, though it does crop up, somewhat mysteriously for the beginning student, in subsequent pages.

I initially put this down to a simple, though perhaps surprising, oversight. I briefly entertained the hope that, apart from this slip, this new translation might still deliver the goods. My hopes sank, however, as I read on in the passage. Frege continues:

Am deutlichsten ist dies vielleich bei der Zahl 0. Wenn ich sage: 'die Venus hat 0 Monde,' so ist gar kein Mond oder Aggregat von Monden da, von dem etwas ausgesagt werden könnte; aber dem Begriffe 'Venusmond' wird dadurch eine Eigenschaft beigelegt, nämlich die, nichts unter sich zu befassen.

Jacquette translates:

This is perhaps clearest in the case of the number 0. If I say 'Venus has 0 moons', then there is no moon or aggregate of moons at all about which anything can be asserted; but the concept 'moon of Venus' thereby adds a property, namely that of including nothing under it.

This reading is based on a misunderstanding of the grammar of the second sentence. Jacquette reads "dem Begriffe" as "the concept," in nominative case, and "wird dadurch eine Eigenschaft beigelegt" as "thereby adds a property." But "dem Begriffe" is dative, and means "to the concept;" "beilegen" means "to ascribe," not "to add;" and "wird … beigelegt" is passive voice, and means "is ascribed." A literally accurate translation would be: "but to the concept 'moon of Venus' a property is thereby ascribed." Moreover, this reading makes a better fit with its context. Given that a statement of number contains an assertion about a concept, it makes sense to say that "Venus has 0 moons" ascribes a property to the concept "moon of Venus." It is unclear what it even means to say that the concept "moon of Venus" "adds a property." Hence Austin's translation, "what happens is that a property is assigned to the concept 'moon of Venus'," while less literal than would strictly speaking be possible, is still clearly to be preferred to Jacquette's.

As I looked into the translation more closely, I found a continual repetition of the problems exhibited in the above examples. Over and over, I came across sentences or passages that didn't make sense. Every time, I discovered errors in the translation -- errors not to be found in Austin's rendition. More than 20 times, Jacquette omits significant bits of Frege's text, ranging from individual words (important words!) to whole sentences; and in more than 100 cases he significantly distorts Frege's meaning.

In the space of this review I cannot go through all of these cases. Here are some examples, which will, I hope, be instructive.

(1) I begin with examples of significant omissions. First, a case in which omission of a key word distorts Frege's meaning: Jacquette translates Frege's account of the a posteriori as follows: "For a truth to be a posteriori, it would be required that its proof be conducted without appeal to facts, that is, to unprovable truths lacking generality, by virtue of involving assertions about particular objects." (19-20) But where Jacquette has "without," Frege writes "nicht ohne," "not without." (GL, 4) Jacquette's version negates what Frege meant to say. Austin, as usual, gets this right.

(2) In the next example, an important phrase is left out that helps to make clear Frege's thought. Writing of the laws of identity, Frege says "Sie werden als analytische Wahrheiten aus dem Begriffe selbst entwickelt werden können." (GL, 76) Jacquette translates: "They are capable of being developed from the concept itself." (68) He leaves out the explanation why this is so, given in the phrase "als analytische Wahrheiten," that is "as analytic truths."

(3) Finally, here is a case in which an entire sentence is omitted, leaving Frege's thought difficult to follow. Frege, arguing that the universal proposition "All whales are mammals" is really about the concepts whale and mammal rather than about individual whales, writes (GL, 60):

Gesetzt, es liege ein Wallfisch vor, so behauptet doch von diesem unser Satz nichts. Man könnte aus ihm nicht schliessen, das vorliegende Thier sei ein Säugethier, ohne den Satz hinzuzunehmen, dass es ein Wallfisch ist, wovon unser Satz nichts enthält. Ueberhaupt ist es unmöglich, von einem Gegenstande zu sprechen, ohne ihn irgendwie zu bezeichnen oder zu benennen.

Jacquette renders this: "Suppose that a whale exists, then our proposition still does asserts [sic] nothing about it. Above all it is impossible to speak of one object without in some way designating or naming it." (57) Here Jacquette omits the second sentence quoted above, which Austin translates: "We cannot infer from it that the animal before us is a mammal without the additional premiss that it is a whale, as to which our proposition says nothing." This sentence makes a crucial transition between the other two. Moreover, attention to its translation shows that "is present" (Beaney; Austin: "is before us"), rather than "exists," is a better reading of "liegt … vor" in the first sentence; for in the second sentence "the animal present" (Beaney; Austin: "the animal before us") makes more sense than "the existing animal" for "das vorliegende Thier."

(4) I turn now to outright translation errors. We have already seen how attention to context can help to identify and correct errors in Jacquette's reading of Foundations. Striking instances of this occur in his translation of the analytical table of contents. In several cases, he mistranslates section summaries in a way that makes no sense, given the content of the sections in question. For example, after discussing in §21 the view of M. Cantor and E. Schröder that number is a property of objects, Frege, in §22, cites approvingly Baumann's objections to this view. In the analytical table of contents, he summarizes these sections as follows: "§21. Meinungen von M. Cantor und E. Schröder. §22. Dagegen Baumann: die äussern Dinge stellen keine strengen Einheiten dar. Die Anzahl hängt scheinbar von unserer Auffassung ab." (GL, vii) Jacquette renders this as: "§21. Opinions of M. Cantor and E. Schröder. §22. Against Baumann: external things represent no strict units. Number apparently depends on our conception." (4) This makes it look as if in §22 Frege argues against Baumann. In fact, he there uses Baumann against Cantor and Schröder. Jacquette has missed the difference between "gegen" ("against") and "dagegen"("against that"), and so reversed Frege's meaning -- a better translation would be "against those opinions, Baumann…"

(5) In a number of cases, Jacquette falls into a similar reversal of meaning. Again, attention to context often makes this clear even prior to direct study of Frege's German. For example, in §65 Frege considers a proposal to define "direction" by using parallelism of lines as a criterion of identity for directions. He asks whether this definition might not lead to violations of the principle of substitutability of identicals. He notes that the only thing we can as yet say about directions is that they are identical, and adds: "Wir brauchten also nur die Ersetzbarkeit in einer solchen Gleichheit nachzuweisen oder in Inhalten, welche solche Gleichheiten als Bestandtheile enthalten würden." (GL, 77) Jacquette renders this: "We therefore need demonstrate only the substitutability in one such identity or in the contents that such identities contain as constituents." (69) But the second disjunct here is wrong; the correct translation of Frege's words is "or in the contents that would contain such identities as constituents" (literally "which such identities as constituents would contain"). Moreover it can be deduced that this is Frege's meaning from the footnote to this sentence, which gives as an example a conditional sentence containing an identity of directions as antecedent or consequent. (There is an error in the translation of the first part of the sentence as well.)

(6) At times, the translation gets so tangled up in German syntax that it doesn't even amount to intelligible English. For example, it is difficult to discern the grammatical structure of the following: "A complex number, as specified here, emerges, like the segment, which, as its representation holds, from a given segment (unit segment) by means of multiplication, division, and rotation." (94) (If we replace "which, as its representation holds" with "which holds as its representation," we get something that is intelligible but misses Frege's meaning in other ways.)

This sentence occurs in a discussion of the geometrical representation of complex numbers as line segments in the plane; Frege's complicated, but perfectly intelligible German reads: "Eine complexe Zahl giebt hier an, wie die Strecke, welche als ihre Darstellung gilt, aus einer gegebenen Strecke (Einheitsstrecke) durch Vervielfältigung, Theilung und Drehung hervorgeht." (GL, 113) Here "giebt hier an" is active voice, not passive, and means "specifies here," not "as here specified;" "wie" means "how," not "like;" and "als … gilt" means something like "passes for," or "is regarded as," not "holds as." A literal rendering of this sentence might therefore read: "A complex number specifies here, how the segment, which is regarded as its representation, develops from a given segment (unit segment) by means of multiplication, division, and rotation." Austin's translation, while less literal, still conveys the sense perfectly: "A complex number, on this interpretation, shows how the segment taken as its representation is reached, starting from a given segment (the unit segment), by means of operations of multiplication, division, and rotation."

(7) In the next example, attention to the historical context indicates a problem in Jacquette's translation. Discussing the idea that arithmetical laws are inductively grounded, Frege objects that the numbers do not have the uniformity needed for inductive methods to apply. He refers to Leibniz's New Essays, quoting a passage (call it "A") in which Philalèthe (Locke's representative) classifies the modes of number as simple modes because their only differences are of more and less, to which Théophile (Leibniz's representative) replies that numbers differ from one another in many other ways (call this "B"). (See New Essays, 70-71.) Frege writes: "Schon Leibniz lässt dem Philalèthe auf seine Behauptung [A] antworten [B]." (GL, 14) Jacquette's translation -- "Leibniz already leaves the assertion [A] open to his Philalèthe to answer [B]." (26) -- has Frege misreading Leibniz, since it is Philalèthe who asserts A and Théophile who answers with B. But Jacquette gets things backwards. Austin correctly conveys Frege's meaning: "Leibniz recognized this already: for to his Philalèthe, who had asserted that (A), he returns the answer (B)."

(8) As a last entry in this catalog of translation problems, I offer an example that raises an interesting question -- how to translate words that are not used, but mentioned. In §54, Frege suggests a way to understand the claim that the "units" said to make up number are indivisible and isolated. His idea is that the concept to which a number is ascribed determines criteria of identity for the items falling under it, such that these items are segregated from one another, with no one of them a part of any of the others. He illustrates this point using the German word "Zahl." If we take as our concept "letters in 'Zahl'" we have four distinct items, none a part of the others, whereas, if we take as our concept "syllables in 'Zahl'" we have only one item, indivisible in the sense that no other syllable is a part of it. (GL, 66)

Austin replaces the word "Zahl" in this stretch of Frege with the non-synonymous English word "three." Jacquette, apparently in order to be more "literal," replaces "Zahl" with its English translation "number." He thus ends up having Frege make the absurd claim that "number" has only one syllable: "The concept 'syllables in the word "number"' singles out the word as a whole and in that sense as something indivisible in that the parts no longer fall under the concept 'syllable in the word "number"'." (61) Austin recognizes that the meaning of the word "Zahl" is irrelevant here -- the word is mentioned, not used, and what matters is its monosyllabic character.

There are many other similar examples of problems in Jacquette's translation. Still, there are occasions when Jacquette manages an improvement over Austin. But these are often combined with errors of the sort discussed above. For example, in §94, Frege remarks that the introduction of new numbers might involve hidden contradictions, and illustrates this point with Hankel's account of "Determinantensätzen" through the introduction of "alternirenden Zahlen." (GL, 106) The former refers to the theory of determinants; the latter is a term introduced in Hankel's mathematical texts for a special kind of number, subject to only some of the ordinary arithmetical laws, and properly translated "alternating numbers." (See for example Geach's translation of the discussion of Hankel in Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, vol. II, §§141-142, FR, 273-4.)

Austin, apparently unaware that "alternirenden Zahlen" is a technical term, translates it as "alternate numbers." Jacquette gives the correct "alternating numbers," but spoils this improvement by translating "Determinantensätzen" as "principles of determinates" rather than "determinants." Moreover, in the next sentence he translates "alternirnende Einheiten" as "alternative units" rather than the correct "alternating units" (89).

Jacquette's translation does not come close to attaining his goal of "a more literally accurate rendering into English of Frege's text." (v) Even when he does produce a literally correct translation, he still misses his further goal, of not "sacrificing the smoothness and above all the beauty and clarity of Frege's prose." (v) Page after page is filled with barely English sentences such as: "For the fact that even mathematicians can conflate the grounds of proof with the internal or external conditions of the conduct of a proof, E. Schröder delivers an amusing example, in that, under the caption, 'Unique Axiom' he presents the following…" (16) "Could a dog by having a view of the moon also have even if only an undetermined idea of that which we signify by the word 'one'?" (44) "It appears in more recent times that the identity of numbers must be defined by means of a univocal correlation has found much approval in the opinion among mathematicians." (66) Readers will be well advised to stick to Austin, whose renditions of the above sentences, even if not always completely literal, are models of good English prose.

Since Jacquette's translation of Frege often exhibits a failure to understand Frege's thought, it is unsurprising that his Introduction and Critical Commentary are replete with confusion and misinterpretation. For example, according to Jacquette, a Fregean Begriffsschrift "must prohibit the occurrence of multiple terms for the same entity" (viii -- if so then there would be no need for an identity sign); "the conventional sense of a term is the set of properties the designated object possesses" (ix -- if so, there could not be different senses associated with the same referent, and again there would be no need for identity); in quotation contexts a name refers "to the conventional sense of the name" (ix -- rather, in indirect discourse, names refer to their conventional senses; in quotation contexts they refer to themselves); concepts are "unsaturated predication contexts" which result from omitting terms from complete expressions (xix-xx -- rather, concepts are the references of such gappy expressions); Frege later gave up the sharp concept-object distinction of Foundations, since he "decided that concepts and functions, despite being incomplete and unsaturated, could after all be objects of higher-order predications in which properties are attributed to them" (xix -- rather, Frege already admits that higher-order concepts can be attributed to lower-order concepts in Foundations, but never concludes that concepts are in any sense objects); Frege deals with real numbers using Dedekind cuts (xxiii -- in fact he has a completely different approach).

Jacquette offers as a criticism of Frege's account of numbers the objection that "Frege's concept of the extension of a predicate or concept term appears on both sides of the definition in Frege's final formulation of the analysis of the concept of a natural number." (xxx) In fact, of course, Frege's definition of the number of the concept F as the extension of the concept 'equinumerous with F' uses the notion of the extension of a concept only in the definiens, not the definiendum. That Jacquette should make this false claim is perhaps explained by his bizarre reconstruction of Frege's account of number. (xx-xxiv) He correctly notes Frege's insistence that to fix the concept of number, we need to fix the sense of a numerical identity. Frege goes on to consider especially identities of the form

The number of the concept F = the number of the concept G.

But Jacquette instead takes as his example the equation "2+3 = 5". He extracts from this the concepts of being identical to 5 and of being identical to 2+3, and then claims:

Frege infers that these identity statements express the fact that the number that belongs to the concept ____ = 2+3, that satisfies the context to produce a true proposition, is the same as the number that belongs to the concept ____ = 5. (xxi)

Already, this is completely confused. The number that belongs to the concept ____ = 2+3 is the number of objects that satisfy this concept, namely one; whereas the object that satisfies the concept ____ = 2+3 is simply 5. From here, things go downhill rapidly, with a confusion between identity of concepts and equinumerosity featuring prominently in the following pages. This leads up to Jacquette's conclusion that Frege's definition of number

identifies the concept of a natural number n in the context n = m with the extension of the concept of having a certain equinumerosity, where the equinumerousity [sic] in question is just the size or cardinality of the extension of the concept term, '= m'. (xxiii)

Insofar as I can understand this at all, it seems to repeat in a general form the confusions in Jacquette's discussion of the simple equation "2+3 = 5"mentioned above. Certainly, it bears no more than a superficial resemblance to anything Frege actually thought or said.

Given the inadequacy of Jacquette's analysis of Frege's arguments and claims, little can be expected from his critical discussion. Jacquette's main criticism is that Frege's definition of numbers is circular, since it assumes a grasp of the concept "one" by using the notion of "one-one correlation" to define equinumerosity. (xxvii) This criticism is weak, since Frege defines "one-one correlation" in Foundations without using the word "one" or any equivalent. Frege himself anticipates and responds to a similar objection to his use of the term "equinumerous" ("gleichzahlig") in his definition of number -- the worry being that in the term "equinumerous" ("gleichzahlig") a grasp of number is presupposed. Frege answers simply that the meaning he is giving to "equinumerous" is determined by his definition, not the linguistic construction of the word, which can be viewed as a simple symbol. (GL, 79) That Jacquette fails to notice the relevance of this response to his own criticism of Frege again shows the extent to which he has misunderstood Frege's philosophical position, arguments, and accomplishments.

It would be nice if I could end this negative review with a positive remark. But the only good thing I can find to say is that the experience of working through this book has heightened my appreciation for Frege's masterpiece and for Austin's marvelous rendering of that masterpiece into English. There is indeed room for a more literal translation of Foundations into English, one that preserves the beauty and clarity of Frege's prose. But this is not that book.


Beaney, Michael, ed. The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997. Cited as FR.

Frege, Gottlob. Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik: Eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl. Breslau: Verlag von Wilhelm Koebner, 1884. Cited as GL.

Frege, Gottlob. Foundations of Arithmetic: A logico-mathematical enquiry into the concept of number. J.L. Austin, tr. Second revised edition. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1980. Since Austin preserves Frege's pagination, separate page references to Austin's translation are omitted in this review.

Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm. New Essays on Human Understanding. P. Remnant and J. Bennett, tr. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1996.