The Foundations of Natural Morality: On the Compatibility of Natural Rights and the Natural Law

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S. Adam Seagrave, The Foundations of Natural Morality: On the Compatibility of Natural Rights and the Natural Law, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 174pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226123431.

Reviewed by Andrew Pinsent, University of Oxford


A premise of S. Adam Seagrave is that there are two antecedent schools of thought regarding the relationship between the modern concept of natural rights and the traditional concept of natural law. On one hand, there is the 'continuity-compatibility position' (5), with natural rights "being derived from and constituting a kind of corollary to the medieval ideas of the natural law" (2). From a variety of perspectives, this position is associated with Jacques Maritain, John Finnis, Brian Tierney, Christopher Wolfe, and to some extent Richard Tuck and Francis Oakley. On the other hand, there is the 'discontinuity-incompatibility position' (14), according to which natural rights and natural law are incompatible and, as a corollary, have discontinuities that can be discerned in logic or historical development. This position is associated with Leo Strauss and a cluster of others including Ernest Fortin, Alasdair MacIntyre, Charles Taylor, Mary Ann Glendon, and Michael Zuckert. Against this background, The Foundations of Natural Morality offers a third way that draws inspiration and early intimations of a solution from John Locke. Seagrave agrees that there is logical and historical discontinuity, but nevertheless argues for an ultimate compatibility between natural rights and natural law (20). As a result, he claims to offer a superior, coherent account of natural morality, one that can also shed light on issues of contemporary political relevance.

Following his introduction, Seagrave begins by reviewing the history of natural rights prior to Locke, both in terms of various derivations from medieval natural law and the discontinuity and reversal effected by Hobbes, according to whom natural right is primary. Locke's place in this history is ambiguous. On one hand, he affirms human beings to be the workmanship and hence property of their divine maker (the 'potter-God'). On this basis, the 'law of nature' appears to be the foundation of morality, according to which "no one ought to harm another in his life, health, liberty, or possessions."[1] On the other hand, Locke also asserts that "man, by being master of himself, and proprietor of his own person, and the actions or labour of it, had still in himself the great foundation of property."[2] Resolving the question of the foundation of natural morality therefore requires an understanding of how Locke distinguishes and relates divine-ownership and self-ownership. Rather than the more conventional lender/receiver approach, Seagrave interprets Locke as grounding this distinction in what is owned. Divine-ownership pertains to the "particular arrangement of powers or faculties that distinguishes humankind from other creatures (and simple non-being)." Self-ownership, by contrast, pertains to "the self-consciousness and personhood that distinguishes one human being from another" (43). On this basis, Seagrave claims, Locke offers a modern concept of natural rights resting on a consideration of the individual as a unique self but 'nested' within an objective context that is more consonant with the natural law tradition than Hobbes' radical departure (54).

The second chapter then presents an argument for an inherent relationship between self-consciousness and self-ownership, which in turn constitutes the foundational natural right in a strict sense, that is, "a basis for moral claims residing within or deriving from the individual" (73). The key point is that the actual self, about which I can say 'my' self, is made continually by the reflective capacity of the individual. The actual self is therefore a radical (indeed the most radical) instance of workmanship, and the primary nature of this work, a matter of fact rather than choice, furnishes the basis of Seagrave's claim to be able to generate normative implications without resorting to 'ought' propositions. Self-ownership has a fixed, ordered relationship to self-consciousness and is hence an incontrovertible natural right (71-74). From this primary natural right, rights can then be established to underpin the Lockean triad of life, liberty, and property (74-81), in a manner that looks at first like modern idealisations of individual autonomy. Nevertheless, this self does not emerge out of nothing but rather is rooted in a shared humanity and a common mode of actualisation.

Hence, in chapter three, Seagrave is able to put forward his second ordering fact (90), namely that an individual's humanity, from which the actual self emerges, has elements beyond merely its reflective capacity. Taken together, these elements constitute what he calls 'human nature' (91) and contain a pattern or blueprint for action. Although I cannot choose to contravene the first ordering fact, the actualisation of myself, I can choose to contravene the second ordering fact, namely the actualisation of myself according to this pattern or blueprint. On this basis, albeit proceeding from a different starting point, Seagrave claims compatibility with the Ciceronian notion of a natural law, the primary command of which is to act in accordance with the superiority of reason, a priority that is also implicit in an Aristotelian account of human nature (98-99). By means of a somewhat longer detour (99-109), he also argues that Aquinas's account of natural law is truly natural in the sense that it is not dependent on God in the order of knowledge (108). Seagrave devotes the remainder of chapter three (109-119) to arguing that his account of natural morality includes something like a legislator and hence a 'law', even in the absence of God, and is superior to the proposals of the 'new natural law' theorists.

The fourth chapter then parades various competing accounts of compatibility between natural law and natural rights, showing their deficiencies in comparison with the proposal of the book. According to Seagrave, Finnis "too easily dismisses the Hobbesian legacy of modern natural rights doctrines" (121), Wolfe argues, in fact, "for the natural law position as opposed to the liberal one" (122), and Tierney's historical method fails fully to "recognize the import of modern ideas of natural rights" (122). The common failure, he claims, is to ignore or too readily dismiss the implicit claim of modern natural rights doctrines, that "natural rights are prior to and independent of the duties or obligations stemming from the natural law conception of the common good" (123). In other words, as Zuckert observes, these scholars "take their stand against modern natural rights" (124). By contrast, Seagrave claims that his proposal grants each moral foundation, natural rights and natural law, "independence from the other while placing both upon a common basis in an inductive encounter with observable reality" (124). This common basis also offers the hope, he claims, of greater compatibility in both theory and concrete application, avoiding contradictions generated by competing rights (128) or between supra-individual traditional approaches and more recent excessive individualism (132). The final sections of this chapter anticipate objections, noting how natural rights and natural law are two sides of natural morality in this conception. Although natural law is ontologically superior, natural right adds insights that were not present in classical conceptions and translates more easily into concrete action (138) and political and legal discourse (140). A final chapter examines some practical implications by exploring the application of this approach to controversies about universal health care, same-sex marriage, and the death penalty (142-160), concluding by emphasising the way in which the natural law and natural rights traditions are brought together in this new conception.

On balance, I think that Seagrave's project is original, ingenious and will, I hope, stimulate further attempts to develop accounts of natural morality that incorporate the best insights of the natural law and natural rights traditions. This work may also stimulate a new understanding of Locke on natural law, although the ambiguities in Locke's texts will no doubt furnish opportunities to challenge details of Seagrave's exegesis. In my judgment, however, the most valuable aspect of the book is that Seagrave treats natural rights neither as simple consequences nor rivals of the natural law tradition but rather as constituting one of the two irreducible 'sides' of natural morality (136). By taking this approach, Seagrave has in effect highlighted, albeit from an unusual direction, a paradox of natural law that is often poorly understood by many of its most ardent defenders. What Michael Ruse might call the 'root metaphors' of natural law are the biological prototypes that inspired Aristotle's philosophy.[3] On this basis, the great hope of natural law has always been the possibility of grounding morality on the fully developed form or nature of a thing, an end that specifies the objective good for that thing. The paradox, however, is that biological, non-human beings, such as acorns or sea lions, do not need a natural law since the possibility does not arise that they would choose not to flourish. On the hand, human beings, for whom such choices do arise, do not fit without remainder into an Aristotelian biological framework alone. In particular, what it means to flourish as a human being is a long-standing question of great subtlety, incorporating a vast diversity of non-Aristotelian concrete instances. This diversity includes heroic and saintly individuals who flourish in non-biological ways and sometimes also in relatively non-intellectual ways. Hence there is a need to go beyond an Aristotelian framework, a task that Seagrave addresses by identifying what he calls the 'other side' of natural morality, namely the irreducible status and consequent moral claims of the individual 'I'.

This positive assessment should, however, be set against certain concerns. As regards details of his arguments, Seagrave claims to avoid the problem of the 'is-ought' distinction by appealing to 'ordering facts' that are "assumed to be fixed beyond the reach of human activity" (72). In other words, in terms of ordering facts such as making oneself and hence owning oneself, human beings are back in the same situation as acorns or sea lions, namely that such ownership arises naturally and is not a matter of choice. This sidestep, however, glosses over the point that although I cannot choose to contravene my self-ownership, this fact does not in itself contain any normative implication regarding your choice of whether or not to contravene my self-ownership, for example by enslavement. After all, the fact that an acorn does not choose to grow into an oak tree does not seem to have any normative implications for my choice to cut the tree down. On this point, I do not think that Seagrave's proposal is in a worse position than that of any other moral theory, but as far as I can judge from the text, it seems disingenuous to suggest that the problem of grounding obligation has been resolved.

A matter of greater strategic concern, however, is the way in which Seagrave retrofits Aquinas into an Ciceronian-Aristotelian tradition of natural law (99-109), thereby filtering out aspects of his work that have important implications for the integration of law and right. Like Locke, Aquinas accords an irreducible status and consequent moral claims to the individual 'I', as can be seen from the vast range of just and unjust actions that he lists in relation to persons, above and beyond the norms arising from the classical understanding of a well-ordered society.[4] Unlike Locke, however, 'I' do not simply form 'my' self in the manner of an isolated self-reflecting 'ego', an approach that almost invariably leads to a cold, calculating kind of morality when extended to others. Instead, 'I' am formed with and in relation to 'you', with the ultimate ordering principle of life and law being friendship (caritas).[5] For Aquinas, this second person is principally God in the life of grace, but the principle of second-person relatedness has a wide range of familiar natural parallels. For example, the second person may be a friend, spouse, parent, or, in some situations, a monarch (for those of us still blessed with such a humane form of government).[6] Such relationality is a key theme of social psychology and neuroscience today and may provide an approach to rights in which notions of property are underwritten and reinforced by friendship, dignity and respect for the other. Hence I anticipate that Aquinas, read as a philosopher of second-person relatedness rather than natural law alone, may ultimately prove the inspiration for a more durable and interesting account of natural morality than Locke.

[1] John Locke, Two Treatises of Government, ed. Peter Laslett (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988), II.ii.6.

[2] Ibid., II.v.44.

[3] Michael Ruse, Science and Spirituality: Making Room for Faith in the Age of Science, 1st ed. (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2010), 24.

[4] See, for example, Summa theologiae (ST) II-II.57-122. These articles include a vast number of non-Aristotelian just and unjust actions such as, for example, sixteen articles on injurious words uttered extra-judicially (II-II.72-76). Many of these articles testify to the irreducible status and consequent moral claims of the individual 'I', beyond an Aristotelian conception of natural justice alone.

[5] For Aquinas in the ST, the form of all the virtues is caritas (II-II.28.8), which he interprets as (divine) friendship (II-II.23.1); friendship is also the principal purpose of law (I-II.99.2).

[6] For further reading on second-person relatedness as the 'root metaphor' of Aquinas's ethics, see Andrew Pinsent, The Second-Person Perspective in Aquinas's Ethics: Virtues and Gifts (New York; Abingdon, UK: Routledge, 2012).