The Founding Act of Modern Ethical Life: Hegel's Critique of Kant's Moral and Political Philosophy

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Ido Geiger, The Founding Act of Modern Ethical Life: Hegel's Critique of Kant's Moral and Political Philosophy, Stanford University Press, 2007, 173pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780804754248.

Reviewed by Jeremiah John, Southern Virginia University


It is an indication of the richness of Hegel's philosophy and of the relevance of much English-speaking Hegel scholarship that literature on Hegel's practical philosophy, even after a generation of careful, philosophically rigorous book-length treatments, continues to explore new territory and to show the importance of Hegel's thought to enduring issues in moral and political philosophy.  Ido Geiger's The Founding Act of Modern Ethical Life is a fine example of this trend.  The Founding Act is also quite striking and unusual, however, on two counts.  First, in no more than 158 pages, Geiger's reach spans from Kantian moral philosophy, to Hegel's philosophy of action, philosophy of history, and political philosophy, to the issue of political founding in Plato's Republic.  Geiger navigates this territory with ease, also bringing to bear contemporary thinkers such as Lacan, Derrida, Arendt and Stanley Cavell.  Second, he cuts against the grain of many standard interpretations of Hegel from the past half-century.  Though I find some of his interpretive claims unconvincing, Geiger presents elegant solutions to many tough puzzles in The Founding Act, and caused me to change my opinion on more than one issue in Hegel.

Geiger introduces his argument with a characterization of a fundamental dichotomy in ethics.  On the one hand there is the perspective which values concreteness, immediacy, particularity, and recognizes that everyday moral life is not governed by universal rules and abstract principles, but given norms that are shared by a community.  On the other hand there is the perspective which prizes formality, universality, and the possibility of reflective distance.  Morality must be serious and critical, so this second viewpoint asserts; it must have the capacity to test the validity of supposed moral norms, and to distinguish the claims of power and mere custom from the true demands of the moral law.  Traditionally (and simplistically), Hegel has been associated with the former position, Kant with the latter.  But more fundamentally, these two sides represent basic aspects of morality, which moral philosophy struggles to bring together.  Geiger claims that a reexamination of the Hegelian critique of Kantian moral philosophy -- followed by an examination of Hegel's political response to Kant's ethics -- will allow us to see a compelling way to reconcile these two fundamental positions.

The common view is that Hegel accused Kant of presenting a purely formal principle of ethics, the categorical imperative, which is nothing more than the principle of non-contradiction.  It is this charge on which Hegel allegedly based his claim that Kantian morality cannot arrive at any actually moral actions at all, because it is "empty" or without content.  This picture has been repeatedly shown to be a caricature of Kant's true teaching.  Geiger himself agrees that it is, and notes that it is difficult to argue against the idea that Hegel advanced it.  But he claims that there is another, more compelling critique of Kant which can also be found in Hegel's writings.  According to Geiger, the real dispute between Kant and Hegel is not about the discovery of moral norms or the conceptual content (or lack thereof) of Kantian morality.  Rather, Hegel's criticism is of Kant's theory of moral motivation.  While Kant famously asserts that one must act from duty and not from inclination (even the inclination to do good, for the pleasure of doing good), Hegel rejects this stipulation.  Indeed, Hegel's Philosophy of Right (specifically the third part) is an attempt, Geiger argues, to portray a system of actualized morality in which individuals find that their tendencies and educated drives incline them to fulfill the moral law.  But Geiger asserts that this claim of Hegel -- that morality can and indeed must be actualized in "a system of shared customs and social institutions" (30) -- necessarily leads to the question of how such a system of actualized morality -- of ethical life -- is founded.

Geiger follows this argument with a very illuminating comparison between Kant's and Hegel's treatments of revolution, which appear in the context of their philosophies of history.  Kant suggests that his age is near the transition from the "epoch of nature to the epoch of freedom" (45) and thus on the path to the moral perfection of humanity.  This is brought about, however, not by a violent political revolution, but rather by "the mode of thinking of the spectators" (45) of revolution.  For Kant, political rebellion is morally forbidden, but the occasion of revolution (he has in mind the French Revolution) is an opportunity for moral reform, a (German) spiritual revolution which occurs passively alongside the violent and lawless political one.  Hegel, on the other hand, sees the origin of the realm of freedom not in the position of the spectator, but in the action of the political revolutionary who commits a violent but necessary founding act.  But this founding act claims an inheritance from Kant, Geiger argues, in that it is characterized as an act of radical beginning, without external motivation or social validation.

Geiger's account of the founding act of ethical life, which follows his discussion of Kant, takes up most of the book.  The account is engaging throughout, in part because Geiger does not pause to give lengthy explanations of certain Hegelian concepts which are central to his argument.  But the fast pace of the argument leaves ambiguities at certain points.  For example, his characterization of Hegel's project in the Philosophy of Right is that "the rational account of a form of life is an account of its historical development -- conceptual and concrete" (30; see also 138).  This seems to be incorrect, or at least misleading, since it appears to assert that for Hegel the conceptual development of right is a part of or an aspect of the historical development of right as portrayed in Hegel's philosophy of history.  In fact the two developments are quite different, as Hegel explains in Philosophy of Right (hereafter PR) §32R, A: "[T]he moments which result from the more developed form [of the concept] precede it … in the scientific development of the Idea, but do not come before it as shapes in its temporal development".  The confusion about this distinction (which Geiger surely understands and actually acknowledges on 53-54, n. 4) seems to have significant implications for Geiger's overall interpretation, since he attributes a historical meaning to some passages where Hegel is giving an account of the conceptual development or structure of ethical life, not its historical emergence.  In several instances where Hegel gives a synchronic account of ethical life, Geiger inappropriately reads a diachronic narrative of the emergence of ethical life.  For example, his interpretation of Hegel's famous double dictum that the "rational is actual and the actual is rational" (PR Preface), focuses almost exclusively on the implications of this statement for the philosophy of history (specifically how the "rational becomes actual", as Hegel put it in his lecture notes), without acknowledging the significant "logical" and metaphysical meaning that Hegel also gave to the couplet (see, e.g. Y. Yovel's "Hegel's Dictum" in The Hegel Myths and Legends, J. Stewart [Northwestern University Press, 1996]: 26-41).  This neglect seems important in this context because the systematic meaning of, e.g., the concept of actuality, is of some significance for understanding the structure which Hegel attributes to ethical life and the state, and by extension for the question (which arises later in Geiger's book) of whether war and oppositions that it involves could be understood by Hegel to be a necessary moment in this structure.

Similar problems arise in Geiger's interpretation of the Antigone passages of the Phenomenology of Spirit.  The first part of chapter VI A, "The Ethical Order", outlines two institutions -- the Family and the City -- which correspond to the Divine Law and the Human Law and to Woman and Man.  Spirit, in the ethical order, is "split up" into these two "ethical substances" (Phenomenology of Spirit [hereafter PhS] §445), or two laws.  Admittedly one of these institutions, the Family, is a private world, an "unconscious, still inner Notion" (PhS §450), while the other is "the superior law whose validity is apparent" (PhS §455).  But both are described as ethical spheres which prescribe duties and roles for their participants.  Connected to family relations -- specifically the brother-sister relation -- is the duty of burial, the "perfect divine law, the positive ethical duty" (PhS §453).  Here, the burial duty is presented as the Family's sole duty, the divine and intimate aspect of the ethical order.  But Geiger seems to interpret all references to burial rites -- even those which appear before the mention of Antigone and the implication of the burial of a traitor (59) -- as violations of the ethical order, indeed as the overthrow of it (see 53-70).  What Hegel calls the "perfect divine law, or the positive ethical action" (PhS §453, emphasis in original) is called by Geiger the violent, unethical founding act of a new form of ethical life (64-69).

In this same vein, Geiger goes to great lengths to characterize Antigone as a fundamentally revolutionary figure, a violent law breaker who destroys one form of ethical life as she unwittingly forms a new one.  It is true that Antigone is for Hegel in the Phenomenology a sort of subversive figure -- her assertion of the right of the family and the Divine Law is for Hegel also wrong in that it fails to recognize the other law of equal worth: that of the city.  On the other hand, Antigone is also the supreme example of the ethical attitude.  The law is in a sense unconscious for Antigone and unacknowledged by the community, but it is clearly known beforehand by Antigone.  The mention of Antigone at the very end of the Reason section (which Geiger interprets historically as a revolutionary prelude to the ethical order) is not a reference to Antigone as law-breaker, but quite the contrary to Antigone as the one who acknowledges the validity of the "ethical substance" whose "relationship of self-consciousness … is equally simple and clear" (PhS §437).  It is this complexity of Hegel's Antigone which Geiger doesn't fully acknowledge.  When Hegel says that the ethical person is "unconscious of himself" (PR §144A), does Geiger's reference to duties and laws not belonging to the ethical sphere, Divine Laws which are subversive of the actual, publicly acknowledged laws (63-67), fully explain it?  It is unclear.  At times Geiger seems to acknowledge that this "unconsciousness" is characteristic of the standard ethical attitude (58).  At others, he seems to associate it only with the abstract, revolutionary perspective of the individual who does not fully understand the meaning and implications of her rebellious actions (58-63).

Geiger presents an account of Hegel's concept of violence which is sophisticated, and it enriches the entire argument of the book, bringing together Hegel's theory of action and theory of war with the concept of a founding act.  Drawing on the Nuremburg writings and on Hegel's concept of crime from the Philosophy of Right, Geiger explains that for Hegel, violence or force (Gewalt) is "a state in which the very value of a person or an act is denied acknowledgement" (125).  The prime example would be ordinary crime, where one person denies the right of another (to their property, to bodily integrity, etc.) through coercion.  But Geiger claims that the founding act of ethical life is also violent, in fact radically violent.  It is certainly true that Hegel associates heroes and founders with violence (see his references to the right of heroes in the PR: see §93A, §150R, §167R, §170R).  And it is also clear that Hegel claims that world-historical individuals are misunderstood -- they die unacknowledged -- by those of their own time.  But how is an act both a founding (something positive, constructive) and an instance of violence (something negative, destructive)?  This is not fully explained.  The case of Antigone seems to be the central example for Geiger, since according to Geiger she commits violence against the Human Law by brazenly breaking it, but she also founds a new ethical order by establishing the worth of the individual.  The textual support here is actually weak, since Hegel nowhere describes Antigone as violent ("the violence of human caprice" is used to describe Creon's action -- see PhS §466), only that her act is characterized by "self-will and disobedience" (§466).  If she is violent, it is only violence to Creon's (violent) command.  Antigone disobeys, she "knowingly commits the crime" (PhS §473), but does not destroy the ethical order; indeed Antigone is reconciled with absolute right (she acknowledges her error) even as she is killed.  It is only the dead Polyneices, who finds instruments of vengeance in the other cities who, outraged over the defiling of their altars, rise up in war against Thebes.  Here the true fall of the ethical order begins (to be completed by the young man of war in PhS §475), not with any positive act of founding, but with an act of vengeance from the world of the dead.

Geiger's other examples of founding violence are long on violence, short on founding.  One which is discussed at length by Geiger -- the radical violence of the Terror during the French Revolution -- is a prime example of an attitude and an event which, according to Hegel, destroyed everything and established nothing.  Geiger also notes that Hegel himself had observed, near the end of his life, that the Napoleonic Wars, and other European wars that followed, had failed to realize freedom in most European countries.  Geiger then concludes that "there is no guarantee that the attempt to found a new life will succeed or freedom prevail" (137).  Where, then, is the founding act of ethical life?

Though the prime examples -- violent founding acts which found nothing or, in the case of Antigone, violate little -- seem to be poor illustrations of the act, perhaps that is just Geiger's point.  The Founding Act ends with a fascinating examination of what Geiger calls the "paradox of founding", this time through the lens of Plato's Republic.  In the context of Hegel's philosophy, the problem of founding was the problem of acting to found a new political reality in the face of the immovable obstacle that all political actions gain their meaning and motivation from existing forms of ethical life.  Thus Antigone's action was unwitting, tragic and misunderstood.  In the context of Plato's Republic, the problem is understood as the difficulty of establishing a meaning-giving, motivating "truth" (i.e. the myth of the metals) when none is ready at hand (and so Socrates must resort to lies).  The founding act is a new speech, which presents itself as old, the invisible deed which establishes the visible "truth" which comes after (146).  Geiger doesn't propose a solution to this paradox, he only describes a quasi-mystical "call" to found a new ethical life, calling it "tragic, utterly abstract, and empty" (148).  As hidden as these founding moments are, yet after a long progress of history, we know that many of them have occurred, however impossible they may seem to those who try to commit them.  This seems to bring us right back where Geiger wants to take us, back to Kant who similarly described the moral act as beginning anew continually.  But what Hegel dismissed as abstract dualism -- acting from duty only, without and even against inclination -- now reappears in a radically more otherworldly form, the unknowing, tragic, self-sacrificing act of founding, the law whose source no one knows, as Antigone puts it, or a law like all those born of the spirit, a wind that blows where it chooses, but no one knows where it comes from or where it goes (John 3:8).

Another important contribution of The Founding Act is Geiger's reinterpretation of Hegel's general view of war, an interpretation which is innovative but, I think, ultimately unsatisfying.  Most modern scholars argue that while Hegel did not exactly glorify war, he did describe it as a necessary means of preserving citizens' ultimate allegiance to the state in the face of the egotistic and individualistic pressures of civil society.  Geiger disagrees, claiming that in his account of war, Hegel is not describing an aspect of ethical life or a necessary condition of its preservation at all, but rather the total destruction of ethical life.  He cites PR §§323-24, where Hegel explains that in war, "the state's absolute power over everything individual and particular, over life, property, and the latter’s rights … gives the nullity of such things an existence" and in war "the vanity of temporal things … takes on a serious significance."  It would seem that these passages support the traditional interpretation, that for Hegel war preserves the allegiance to the state and prevents social disintegration by showing its superiority to mere individuals-for-themselves and to property.  But Geiger claims that because the "values of the state are incarnate in the everyday lives of the citizens", then the nullity of property and private rights in war must mean that "[w]ar is the destruction of all value" (102, emphasis in original).  This conclusion seems to result from a misunderstanding of the structure of the state as Hegel understands it.  It is true that the state is not an institution which stands completely separate from the family and civil society and lords it over them.  Indeed, Hegel writes that "[t]hese institutions together form the constitution … in the realm of particularity, and they are therefore the firm foundation of the state … [t]hey are the pillars on which public freedom rests" (PR §265).  But the state is also a "universal interest" at the same time that it is the "conservation of particular interests" (PR §270).  In this sense the state has an "infinite", even divine quality that is lacking in the finite spheres of individual, family, and social life (PR §324R).  It is true that the richness, and much of the living "stuff" of ethical life, exists through the basic harmony between particular, individual satisfaction and the universal value of the state; a state which continually denied its citizens these enjoyments but still demanded the sacrifice of life and limb (e.g. the state as an armed camp) would be a very poor state from Hegel's perspective.  But Hegel also clearly states, speaking of the fate of property relations and private associations in wartime, that the "ethical health of nations is preserved in the indifference towards the permanence of finite determinacies" (PR §324R).

Hegel's discussion of the military class and the disposition specific to it should be helpful in making this distinction clear.  Geiger is right that patriotism for Hegel is not a warrior virtue, but rather the tendency to know and recognize that one's own interests and rights are preserved in the state.  In this sense it is like the patriotism that Tocqueville saw in Americans, the strong attachment to the community founded not upon a rootedness in blood and soil but an appreciation of individual rights and material prosperity.  Patriotism is "the political disposition" (PR §268) which in "normal conditions … knows the community" as its end (PR §268R).  But war has its virtue as well, which Hegel calls valor (Tapferkeit) (PR §§325, 327-28).  Far from being the destructive, completely negative attitude of Absolute Freedom and the Terror (from the Phenomenology), which Geiger sees as the example of war par excellence for Hegel, valor has as its end the sovereignty of the state (PR §328).  It is true that for Hegel valor is only a "formal" virtue, in that it "embodies the harshness of extreme opposites"; here it is clear that for Hegel, war is not to be glorified, not to be understood as the normal or ordinary situation of ethical life.  But the virtue of valor is not the quality of a wild radical, but rather of the military estate, whose war-making in the modern world loses its formerly individualistic characteristics and gains a universalistic, rational quality as soldiers learn to fight as part of an organized whole (PR §327A).  In this context Geiger's claim that war is the destruction of all value, and the end of everything ethical, is puzzling.  Military valor, according to Hegel, not only aims to preserve and establish the sovereignty of the state, but belongs to an established class within the ethical order, with its own unique dispositions and habits and its own forms of organizational integration.  If Hegel's ethical life is, put simply, the education of the drives and inclinations to moral activity, and the public acknowledgment of certain shared norms and institutions, then it seems that the military estate and its activity are a part of ethical life rather than the destruction of it.

It is surprising that Geiger makes no mention at all of the two very clear examples of war in chapter VI A of the Phenomenology, the part he addresses at length in connection with Antigone in chapter 3.  There Hegel explicitly gives one example of revolutionary war (in the transition from the stage of "Ethical Action" to the stage of "Legal Status"), and one example of non-revolutionary war which is part of the normal life of the state.  In the first instance, it is not the unwitting and noble act of Antigone which constitutes the final violent founding, but rather the "merely evil" (PhS §475) principle of the young man who recognizes that the power of the city lies in his own strength.  As soon as this realization occurs, the ethical life of the city is doomed.  What is left in its wake is a kind of social order, but a "soulless and dead" one (PhS §475).  Here the violent act founds nothing new, but leaves only the principle of individualism as the basis for the new order, "Legal Status".

The other, earlier example of war refutes the claim that for Hegel "war is always the destruction of ethical life" and is "always related to the struggle for a new political beginning" (133).  There Hegel explains that the city contains within it systems of personal independence and association.  In order to prevent these systems from breaking loose in a spirit of separatism, the government must "from time to time … shake them to their core through war" (PhS §455).  In war the "stable existence" of these subordinate systems are "thrown into the melting pot"; indeed war, this "negative essence", shows itself to be the "real power of the community, and the force of its self-preservation" (§273, emphasis added).  Far from being the destruction of ethical life, war preserves the ethical life in its proper order.  It is remarkable how clearly this passage echoes the language Hegel uses to describe war later in the Philosophy of Right, and how much it supports the more conventional interpretation of Hegel's view of war.  As Geiger admits, it is not because Hegel scholars generally like this view of war that they attribute it to Hegel; quite the contrary (97).  But it seems quite evident in the texts that Hegel believed that war could in many cases preserve and promote the proper order of ethical life as much as it could in other situations be associated with the destruction of the ethical.

As evidenced by this long review, the engaging arguments in The Founding Act of Modern Ethical Life are good starting points for many stimulating explorations of Hegel's thought in particular and political philosophy in general.  Though I find a few of Geiger’s major claims unconvincing, his short book will be useful to students of political philosophy and to Hegel scholars for some time to come.