The Founding of Aesthetics in the German Enlightenment: The Art of Invention and the Invention of Art

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Stefanie Buchenau, The Founding of Aesthetics in the German Enlightenment: The Art of Invention and the Invention of Art, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 272pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107027138.

Reviewed by Frederick Beiser, Syracuse University


Stefanie Buchenau's book is an important contribution to recent efforts to re-examine and rehabilitate the rationalist tradition of aesthetics. It appears some four years after my own work in this direction, Diotima's Children (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009). Buchenau and I have very similar goals -- the restoration of rationalist aesthetics -- and employ similar historicist methods -- treating these authors as ends in themselves and not as forerunners or foils to Kant. We have, however, gone down different roads in trying to achieve our goals. Perhaps this is due to a bibliographical fluke on her part: Buchenau learned about my book only after she finished the draft of hers and sent it in for review (8n20). In any case, it is just as well, because her approach is very different from mine and complements my own. I have learned much from her book.

Buchenau approaches the rationalist tradition from the perspective of the early modern project for an ars inveniendi, i.e., an art of invention or discovery of truth. She shows how this epistemological project, which has its origins in Francis Bacon, was fundamental for the aesthetics of the early rationalists, especially for Christian Wolff and his early disciples, Johann Jakob Bodmer, Johann Jakob Breitinger, Johann Christoph Gottsched and Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten. Wolff was a champion of the ars inveniendi because, following Bacon, he saw a close connection between knowing and doing: we could know nature only if we knew how to act upon her, to make her submit to our questions; and we knew how to act upon her only through the different arts. The ars inveniendi would give us general rules about how all the particular arts proceed, and so help us in the discovery of the truth. Although Wolff himself was not much interested in developing a theory of the fine arts (to use an anachronistic expression), his disciples took up his project and applied it to some particular arts, especially poetry. Their hope was to find an ars inveniendi for each of the particular arts (poetry, painting, music), and indeed for fine art in general, to help the artist in the production of beauty.

Buchenau shows how the project for an ars inveniendi was vital for the young rationalists, and how they developed this project for the particular arts. She is entirely correct about the importance of this project, and her emphasis upon it enables her to criticize and correct one of the most persistent misconceptions of the rationalist tradition: the anachronistic but influential thesis of Alfred Bäumler that Baumgarten's grand contribution to aesthetics was transmitting irrationalist ideas about the je ne sais quoi to Kant. As she rightly points out (154), Baumgarten regarded reason as the defining characteristic of a human being, and he was interested more in expanding than limiting the sphere of reason.

Although Buchenau's approach is illuminating and important, it still has its limits with regard to her broader objective: "recovering a tradition that once was ours but has been lost to us" (236). The problem is that the project for an ars inveniendi proved bankrupt, or at least very problematic, in the face of Kantian criticism. Buchenau herself notes Kant's formidable criticisms of this project -- her Kant scholarship leaves nothing to be desired -- which began in the 1760s. Kant argued that the art of invention is circular: it shows us how to discover truth only after we have already discovered it; its rules are too general and do not give us knowledge about any particular case. If re-examining rationalist aesthetics means rehabilitating this project, it is clear that it cannot, and indeed should not, get off the ground. Buchenau herself thinks that the project is a non-starter, but she still maintains that it gives us some worthwhile philosophical and historical perspectives: it will enrich our thinking about the connection between the arts and sciences, about the relationship between art and language, about the relevance of art to practical and moral art, and so on (233-6). But all this has little to do with the intrinsic merits of the idea of an ars inveniendi. It is clear that these perspectives are only flotsam and jetsam, and that the proud ocean liner named Aesthetica has sunk to the bottom of the sea. The central philosophical claims of the rationalist tradition are thus abandoned with the ars inveniendi.

Because "the prism of invention" leads to this catastrophic result, I approached the rationalist tradition from a different angle in Diotima's Children. While I noted the importance of the ars inveniendi for Wolff, I did not make it my chief perspective to view this tradition, because I knew that its abiding philosophical value does not, and should not, depend upon it. My chief perspective was that of aesthetic judgment. This is not a theme invented by Kant; the early rationalists had a subtle and sophisticated theory of aesthetic judgment, which they developed long before Kant, and which is the antithesis to the Kantian theory. The central thesis of the rationalist theory is that aesthetic pleasure consists in the perception of perfection; in other words, an aesthetic judgment is based upon an intuitio perfectionis, where perfection involves beauty, which is concinnitas or harmonia, i.e., unity in variety, sameness in diversity.

This theory of aesthetic judgment is a challenge to all theories like Kant's, which hold that aesthetic pleasure is entirely subjective, a feeling that has "no reference whatsoever to any feature of an object" (§1, Kritik der Urteilskraft). The problem with the subjectivist theory is that it makes it impossible to justify aesthetic judgments, to explain why I like perceiving one object rather than another. We cannot refer to any feature of the object itself to say why we like perceiving it rather than some other object; we like perceiving it -- because we like it, and that is all. We can appeal to common sense and universal communicability all we like, as Kant does, but that does not explain why we prefer perceiving one object rather than another. In short, the subjectivist theory violates the principle of sufficient reason, which demands that there be a reason why we prefer seeing this object rather than that. The great advantage of the rationalist theory is that it obeys this principle by pointing to some feature of the object itself, which serves as the reason for taking pleasure in perceiving it rather than some other thing. I refer stubborn skeptics about the rationalist theory to one of its greatest critics: David Hume. Delicacy, argued Hume, is vital to aesthetic experience, it being the power to detect fine features in the object itself.

Obviously, I cannot go very far here in vindicating the rationalist theory of aesthetic judgment. My only point is that it is a far more viable aspect of the rationalist tradition, and that our attempts to revive it do better to focus on it rather than the ars inveniendi.

Besides this major difference in perspective, I have several substantive criticisms about Buchenau's interpretation of the rationalist tradition, which, for reasons of space, I give in condensed form here. 1) Buchenau tells us little or nothing about the opponents of the rationalists, about those whom they were arguing against, though this is clearly crucial for the philosophical understanding of them. The rationalist theory of aesthetic judgment was from the very beginning a critique of the empiricist theory. She is incorrect in holding that the Wolffians ignored the British and Scottish traditions (217). 2) Buchenau ignores the debate about the different kinds of aesthetic experience, about the status of the sublime, picturesque and tragic, and whether they are reducible to beauty. Rationalist aesthetics was very much an aesthetic of beauty, and for many rationalists the central question was whether this could be the sole form of aesthetic experience. This was at the heart of the Dichterkrieg -- the dispute between Gottsched and the Swiss aestheticians Bodmer and Breitinger -- which Buchenau does not consider. Her own reading of this dispute is much too thin and anachronistic, as if it could be boiled down to the antinomy of Kant's critique of judgment.

3) Buchenau's Her own account of the rationalist concept of perfection attaches it too closely to a purpose or utility (56-59). If we take that line, then Kant is correct that the rationalist cannot explain the experience of pure beauty, which presupposes no concept of a definite purpose or end. But the rationalist concept of perfection is fundamentally that of unity in variety, which is a formal feature of objects; it does not necessarily presuppose a purpose. Kant rightly saw this point, and praised the rationalists for it. Buchenau thinks he misunderstood them, but he understood them all too well. 4) Buchenau thinks that the rationalists were committed to the demonstration of aesthetic judgments, but few of them ever went so far. Their task was to justify aesthetic judgments, to satisfy the principle of sufficient reason, which could come from looking at objects and identifying their features, and did not require constructing long trains of demonstration. 5) Last but not least, it is worthwhile to stress that Buchenau's perspective applies best to the early phase of the rationalist tradition. She does not discuss some of its central figures: Winckelmann, Mendelssohn, Meier, and Lessing. When we look at them, the prism of invention begins to obscure and cease to be a helpful guide. Here the prism of aesthetic judgment remains clear and is a reliable guide for the interpretation of the whole tradition.

All these, however, are detailed points, and most of them sins of omission. It should be obvious that with such a rich intellectual tradition as aesthetic rationalism one can only do so much in a single monograph. What Buchenau has done is more than enough; it is a major achievement, greatly increasing our understanding of aesthetic rationalism. No one interested in aesthetics should ignore her book. Only an appreciation of the past will get contemporary aesthetics out of its doldrums. This book is the medicine contemporary aestheticians need.